Before Virtue: Assessing Contemporary Virtue Ethics

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Jonathan Sanford, Before Virtue: Assessing Contemporary Virtue Ethics, The Catholic University of American Press, 2015, 280pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780813227399.

Reviewed by Micah Lott, Boston College


This book has two main parts. In the first (chapters one though four), Sanford gives a largely critical assessment of contemporary virtue ethics (VE). The core of his criticism is that "mainstream" VE is un-Aristotelian in many ways, and that it "lacks a substantive unity of the sort that entails a cohesive, comprehensive, and coherent moral theory" (142). In the second part (chapters six through eight), Sanford gives an overview of an Aristotelian-Thomistic ethics that he takes to be a superior alternative to mainstream VE. The hinge between these two parts is chapter five, in which Sanford argues that Aristotle's ethics is not a virtue ethics, in the sense defined by mainstream VE.

Central to Sanford's discussion is the distinction between mainstream VE and "unconventional" VE. For him, this distinction is best understood in terms of Elizabeth Anscombe's "Modern Moral Philosophy" -- a paper from 1958 that is widely seen as helping to launch the contemporary virtue ethics movement. Unconventional VE sides with Anscombe in thinking that modern moral philosophy is deeply misguided, and it seeks to provide a radical alternative. Into this group, Sanford places figures such as Alasdair MacIntyre, Philippa Foot, and (I think) Julia Annas and Talbot Brewer. In contrast, mainstream VE seeks to share the stage with deontology and consequentialism, as another option within the basic framework of modern moral philosophy. At the head of the mainstream group -- and in many ways Sanford's chief target for criticism - is Rosalind Hursthouse. Two other prominent members of mainstream VE are Michael Slote and Christine Swanton.

Sanford argues that mainstream VE goes wrong by taking on assumptions about moral theory that are characteristic of "the modern moral project". Chief among these assumptions are "that a successful moral theory must guide action in some direct way, provide a means by which a moral agent can move from egoism to altruism, and specify some distinctive motivational state that marks off moral from nonmoral sorts of actions" (121). Sanford rejects all of these assumptions.

Related to this, Sanford argues that mainstream VE has lost touch with Anscombe's insights about what is wrong with modern moral philosophy. Because Anscombe's paper is so important for Sanford, it is worth recalling her three theses in "Modern Moral Philosophy":

The first is that it is not profitable for us at present to do moral philosophy; that should be laid aside at any rate until we have an adequate philosophy of psychology, in which we are conspicuously lacking. The second is that the concepts of obligation, and duty -- moral obligation and moral duty, that is to say -- and of what I morally right and wrong, and of the moral sense of "ought", ought to be jettisoned if this is psychologically possible; because they are survivals, or derivatives from survivals, from an earlier conception of ethics which no longer generally survives, and are only harmful without it. My third thesis is that the differences between the well-known English writers on moral philosophy from Sidgwick to the present day are of little importance.[1]

Sanford seems most concerned that mainstream VE has neglected -- or in some cases, rejected -- the first and third of Anscombe's theses. Mainstream VE has failed to heed Anscombe's call for an adequate philosophical psychology. Were mainstream VE to do so, then it must address the questions that are at the heart of Aristotelian moral philosophy: "What is human nature? What is the purpose of human life? And by what means can we judge progress made toward achieving the goal of human life?" (141). Such questions, Sanford claims, are the "fundamental background questions of moral philosophy" (17), and answering them would yield the philosophical psychology that Anscombe called for. But mainstream VE largely neglects these questions.

Anscombe's third thesis concerns her claim that consequentialism is the defining mark of Sidgwick and "every English academic moral philosopher since him".[2] As Sanford recognizes, Anscombe did not use "consequentialism" in the way that term is typically understood in moral philosophy today -- as a view that "assesses acts and/or character traits, practices, and institutions solely in terms of the goodness of the consequences".[3] Rather Anscombe understood consequentialism as the position that no type of action is so evil or wrong that it could not be justified, in some circumstances, in terms of the consequences that might follow from performing or not performing the action. For Anscombe, then, the defining feature of consequentialism is its rejection of moral absolutes, in the sense of absolutely prohibited types of action. Thus one could be a non-consequentialist in the now standard terminology, but still count as a consequentialist for Anscombe -- e.g., a Rossian pluralist who held that our basic moral duties include non-outcome regarding duties (keep your promises, etc.), but that these only give prima facie reasons that can always be outweighed, in particular cases, by an outcome regarding duty to promote the good.

Sanford considers Slote to be a clear consequentialist in Anscombe's sense (74-75). And he claims that Hursthouse shows a "consequentialist tendency" (96; cf. 75 -- 78). For Sanford, the abandonment of moral absolutes is a disaster. Moral absolutes are "at the heart of genuine moral education" (112) and non-absolutism is "a new barbarism" (73). Worst of all, "the consequentialism [Anscombe] so presciently exposed and sought to war against has come to be reshaped and reconfirmed by the very arsenal she sought to use against it, Aristotelianism" (112).

After laying out his complaints against mainstream VE, Sanford lays out ten features of Aristotle's ethics. Each of these is so important, Sanford claims, that significant departure from any of them is enough to disqualify a view from being Aristotelian in a sufficiently relevant sense. The ten features are:

  1. Aristotelian ethics finds incoherent the designation of a distinctive sphere of human action definable as "the moral" (153).
  2. Aristotelian ethics is nonconsequentialist, in the Anscombian sense (153).
  3. Aristotelian ethics insists on the paramount importance of contemplative wisdom (154).
  4. Aristotelian ethics insists happiness is the activity of virtue (157).
  5. Aristotelian ethics insists that practical wisdom, not the practically wise person, directs the truly virtuous to right action (161).
  6. Aristotelian ethics insists it is impossible to exercise any virtue, with the exception of technical skill, wrongly (163).
  7. Aristotelian ethics does not, and cannot, endorse a selfless and generic benevolence (167).
  8. Aristotelian ethics makes friendship thematically central (170).
  9. Aristotelian ethics insists on the intelligibility and indispensable importance of the virtue of justice (173).
  10. Aristotelian ethics insists that to be human is to be communal (177).

In laying out these features, Sanford emphasizes the various ways that mainstream virtue ethicists -- including "most neo-Aristotelians of the mainstream variety" -- ignore or depart from them. Thus he concludes that mainstream VE is, to a large extent, Aristotelian in name but not substance. For Sanford, this shows that the complaints against mainstream VE made in the earlier chapters do not apply to a truly Aristotelian ethics.

Sanford recognizes that mainstream virtue ethicists have a ready reply to the accusation that they depart from Aristotle: So what? Surely as philosophers we are not interested in arguments from authority, so why should be care simply because our views don't line up with Aristotle's? Sanford's response comes in the next three chapters, in which he sketches what he takes to be a truly Aristotelian ethics, and attempts to show that it offers the best answers to the questions about human nature and the purpose of human life mentioned above -- the "fundamental background questions of moral philosophy".

In chapter six, "Anthropology in Aristotelian Ethics", Sanford lays out the Aristotelian idea that the virtues are perfections of human nature. Chapter seven, "Teleology in Aristotelian Ethics", deals with virtue, happiness, and final ends. Chapter eight, "Natural Law in Aristotelian Ethics", focuses on practical reason and justice, and attempts to show the difference between natural law reasoning and modern contractarianism. Throughout these chapters, Sanford draws on the work of MacIntyre.

I agree with Sanford (and many others) in thinking that the category of "virtue ethics", while sometimes a useful tool for classification, often obscures deep and important differences among the thinkers to whom that label is applied. Moreover, I agree with Sanford that Aristotelian ethics is different in important ways from much of what is described as "virtue ethics", and that the former is more promising and interesting than the latter. If someone simply equates "contemporary virtue ethics" and "Aristotelian ethics", then Sanford's book is a useful corrective.

However, I have some reservations. First, there are serious omissions. Of course, even when one aims to assess a large movement in philosophy, as Sanford does, one cannot be expected to consider every thinker or text relevant to that movement. Still, some omissions will be so serious that they undermine the success of the assessment, since the thing one aims to assess will not have been properly brought into view. To my mind, the omissions in Before Virtue are of this sort. Most surprisingly, Sanford makes no mention of the work of Michael Thompson. This is odd, given that Thompson's work is important to both Foot and Hursthouse, whom Sanford discusses often. Moreover, in Life and Action, Thompson does precisely the thing that Sanford complains is not being done -- he attempts to given an account of foundational concepts in practical philosophy (life, action, practice), and he does so in a way that is broadly Aristotelian and that draws explicitly on Anscombe.[4]

Other important omissions include: John Haldane, Richard Kraut, Mark LeBar, Anselm Müller, Roger Teichmann, and Candace Vogler.[5] In very different ways, each of these thinkers has addressed the foundational questions about human nature and philosophical psychology that Sanford wants to see taken up by moral philosophers. To varying degrees, all of these thinkers can be classified as "Aristotelian", and some of them draw heavily on Anscombe. All of them have things to say about virtue.

Perhaps Sanford does not discuss these thinkers because they are not commonly thought of as "virtue ethicists", or do not describe themselves that way. But if that is the case, then I start to wonder why Sanford (or anyone else) should be interested in an assessment of VE in the first place. If what one really values is Aristotelian ethics, then why not turn to those areas of moral philosophy where that work is being done? Why focus instead on VE and then complain that it is insufficiently Aristotelian? One often gets the feeling that Sanford has not found what he is looking for, simply because he has placed an artificial limit on where he is willing to look.

A second weakness is that Sanford tends to paint his philosophical opponents with very broad brush strokes, as when he refers to "the individualism at the heart of the modern moral and political project" (110). I doubt the helpfulness of speaking about the modern moral and political project, rather than recognizing the range of different projects. And clearly "individualism" has been understood in significantly different ways in various modern moral and political projects.

Third, on the topic where Sanford is most impassioned -- moral absolutes -- there is a noticeable lack of argument. Sanford endorses the view, which he finds in Anscombe, that "those who are willing to consider the suspension of moral absolutes for the obtainment of so-called good results are not in fact engaging in moral philosophy" (71). For Sanford, a moral theory must rely upon moral absolutes to so much as be moral philosophy; otherwise it is "sophistry" and "rationalizing" (71). This is a very strong and counter-intuitive claim. Consider a rule-consequentialism that rejects exceptionless moral absolutes. Even if we grant, for the sake of argument, that this view is mistaken, that doesn't give us any reason to think that rule-consequentialism is not moral philosophy at all, or that rule-consequentialists are mere sophists! To draw that conclusion, we would need much further argument. So far as I can tell, Sanford provides no argument at all here. Indeed, Sanford gives no arguments for even the much weaker (but still very controversial) claim that moral absolutism is true.

Another limitation is that when Sanford sketches out his Aristotelian-Thomistic view in the final three chapters, he often does not engage with important criticisms of that view. For instance, Sanford quotes the following passage from Aquinas:

Now each thing is inclined naturally to an operation that is suitable to it according to its form: thus fire in inclined to give heat. Wherefore, since the rational soul is the proper form of man, there is in every man a natural inclination to act according to reason: and this is to act according to virtue. Consequently, considered thus, all acts of virtue are prescribed by the natural law: since each one's reason naturally dictates to him to act virtuously (233).

In the paragraph that follows this quotation, Sanford says, "At this level of the theory, it is difficult to see what all the consternation concerns when the natural law is identified for condemnation by its contemporary opponents." (233). I don't know why Sanford is so sanguine. On the contrary, a number of objections quickly leap to mind: (1) When natural law reasoning makes these connections between our nature, our ends, and the virtues, it supposes that human nature is a teleological unity. But that assumption is unwarranted. In fact, a more realistic view is that "human beings are to some degree a mess, and that the rapid and immense development of symbolic and cultural capacities has left humans as beings for whom no form of life is likely to prove entirely satisfactory, either individually or socially".[6] (2) Given a Darwinian account of human beings, we have reason to think that some of what is "natural" for human beings is actually bad for us, and hence we shouldn't grant any rational authority to what is natural per se.[7] (3) Because of our ability, as practical reasoners, to "step back" from any natural inclinations and to call them into question, nature per se cannot have any normative authority for us: "that something is natural, or even has a proper function, cannot in itself settle anything in its favor", and this torpedoes all natural law attempts to ground practical normativity in nature.[8]

I am not claiming these objections are decisive against Aristotelian-Thomistic natural law thinking. The point is simply that there serious objections to a natural law approach to (meta)ethics, and that Sanford does not engage with them. And this is characteristic of all three chapters in which Sanford sketches the Aristotelian-Thomistic view. The overall effect is that these chapters break little new ground in terms of developing Aristotelian ethics or defending it against its critics.

To be fair, breaking new ground is not Sanford's goal in the second part of the book. He describes what he is doing there as "schematic", "a beginning", and "a modest defense of Aristotelian ethics". (185) Readers interested in an introduction to Aristotelian-Thomistic ethics, with a heavy reliance on MacIntyre, will find these chapters of interest.

[1] "Modern Moral Philosophy" in Ethics, Religion and Politics (Basil Blackwell, 1981) 26.

[2] Ibid., 36.

[3] Brad Hooker, "Rule Consequentialism," Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (2011) 2.

[4] Michael Thompson Life and Action (Harvard University Press, 2008).

[5] One of Teichmann's books is in the bibliography to Before Virtue, but he is not mentioned in the index or, so far as I can tell, anywhere in the main text. Kraut's work on Aristotle is cited in one footnote, but not his more recent work on ethics and normativity. Haldane is mentioned in two footnotes, but his work is never discussed in the text.

[6] Bernard Williams, "Evolution, Ethics and the Representation Problem," in Making Sense of Humanity (Cambridge University Press, 1995) 109.

[7] For thoughts along these lines, see Allen Buchanan Beyond Humanity? The Ethics of Biomedical Enhancement (Oxford University Press, 2011) chapter four.

[8] William Fitzpatrick, "Robust ethical realism, non-naturalism, and normativity," in Oxford Studies in Metaethics: Volume 3 (Oxford University Press, 2008) 172.