Behaving: What's Genetic, What's Not, and Why Should We Care?

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Kenneth F. Schaffner, Behaving: What's Genetic, What's Not, and Why Should We Care?, Oxford University Press, 2016, 287pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195171402.

Reviewed by Jonathan Kaplan, Oregon State University


Kenneth F. Schaffner's book aims to bring the reader up-to-date on some of the philosophical issues that surround behavior genetics (especially human behavior genetics) and psychiatric genetics (a closely related field). Doing this requires that Schaffner bring the reader up-to-date on some of recent work in behavior genetics more generally, including several chapters whose primary goal is familiarizing the reader with some of the basics of behavioral genetics and development in C. elegans ("the worm").

One major theme is "reductionism" -- in what way(s) can behavior be explained by "lower level" phenomena? Can we explain (in whole or in part) and/or predict, particular behaviors on the basis of accounts at the level of neurons? of genes? of other more basic behaviors? Schaffner distinguishes between "sweeping reductionism" -- where for example some "very powerful biological theory" might explain "all of psychology and psychiatry" -- and "creeping reductionism," in which, "bit by bit we get fragmentary explanations using interlevel mechanisms" (p. 118). "Sweeping reductionism" proves too big a challenge even for the relatively simple model organism C. elegans, with its limited behavioral repertoire and a mere thousand some-odd cells. "Creeping reductionism," while less satisfying in principle, can still lead to "potentially Nobel Prize-winning accomplishments in unifying and deepening significant, though 'local,' areas of scientific investigation" (pp. 191-192).

The first two chapters lay out the basics of quantitative genetics and molecular genetics, respectively. Schaffner uses an imagined dialog between a behavior genetics expert and a judge to tease out of some of the wrinkles in the methodologies discussed. With respect to quantitative genetics, while it is probably impossible to write about heritability in a way that other people who study heritability will find entirely unproblematic, he does a good job avoiding the most common pitfalls in these discussions (indeed, my own views on the best ways to present this material have changed over time; readers might look at differences between how I treated heritability in a my first book (2000) and in a relatively recent blogpost (2015)). The chapter on the methods used in molecular genetics is clear, with enough detail to give readers a sense of the methodologies deployed without bogging them down in unnecessary details.

Chapter 3 deals primarily with the so-called "developmentalist challenge" to behavior genetics (and to dichotomized nature-nurture thinking more generally, as well as to e.g. the information metaphor as applied to DNA). Schaffner uses a detailed discussion of the role of genes in the behaviors of C. elegans to generate a list of eight "rules" that relate genes to behaviors (via neurons) in C. elegans. In brief, he argues that work on C. elegans shows that even for the simplest model organisms for behavior genetics, there is a "many-many" relationship between genes and neurons (rules 1 and 3), and between neurons and behavior (rules 2 and 4); that the development of neural connections is stochastic (rule 5); that different environments will generate different behaviors (both in the short term, and in the long term) (rules 6 and 8); and that behavior can be influenced by gene-gene interactions (epistasis and combinatorial effects) (rule 7) (p. 93).

With these rules in hand, Schaffner considers what he takes to be the primary claims of the developmentalist challenge: parity between genetic and non-genetic developmental resources; nonpreformationism (traits do not pre-exist development "in the genes"); contextualism (whatever meaning genes have, they have it only in the context of the developmental system); indivisibility (genes and environments cannot be identified as having separable effects on traits in any legitimate sense); and unpredictability (that even from the total information about genes and developmental environments, we would not be able to predict an organism's traits) (p. 95). Nonpreformationsism and contextualism, Schaffner argues, emerge naturally from C. elegans research, and so those aspects of the developmentalist challenge are unproblematic (though, he suggests, the challenge isn't really necessary as no serious researcher supports preformationism or any strong non-contextualism) (p. 97). Parity, Schaffner admits, is complex. As a causal thesis about what is necessary for the development of traits, he broadly supports it, but  heargues that, epistemically and heuristically, genes are viewed by (some) worm researchers as having a kind of priority that violates the parity thesis, a view to which he is sympathetic (pp. 96-97).

Similarly, Schaffner argues that indivisibility and unpredictability are broadly contradicted by C. elegans work: researchers do acknowledge that the "causal schema is a complex web or network" but they still believe that the causal effects of different resources can be distinguished; and while researchers do acknowledge some stochasticity, they do not support a stronger unpredictability thesis (pp. 97-98). While I am more sympathetic to the developmentalist challenge than he is, and tend to interpret the primary claims (especially those surrounding parity) somewhat more charitably, Schaffner is at least not markedly uncharitable in his interpretations, and his analysis of C. elegans, if taken to be about the minimum level of complexity one ought to expect from behavior genetics research, is powerful. I do wish, however, that he had addressed more of the arguments surrounding parity and the informational metaphors. While Schafffner deals seriously with the arguments of e.g. Paul Griffiths, Karola Stotz, and Susan Oyama, those from e.g. Lenny Moss (e.g. 2003) are elided here.

In the very brief Chapter 4 ("What's a Worm Got to Do with It?"), Schaffner argues that the lessons from C. elegans research -- the "rules" that relate behaviors to genes -- described in Chapter 3 should be expected to have general applicability to other organisms, including humans. While there are complexities in humans (language, culture, agency, intention) that "worm studies" won't be able to elucidate, many basic developmental mechanisms will be approachable via studies of such model organisms, and some of those basic mechanisms will likely prove useful for understanding some aspects of even more complex behaviors (pp. 112-113). Chapter 5  explores the idea of reductionism more generally, some of the different senses of "reduction," and some of the basics of scientific explanation. Schaffner argues that many biological explanations of behaviors are partial reductions -- the explanations appeal to entities at several different levels (genes, proteins, neurons, etc.), some parts of the proposed pathways remain unidentified in the explanations, the explanations only work for some (rather than for all) instances of the behaviors in question, etc. (see e.g. pp. 134-135).

Chapters 6 ("Human Behavioral Genetics") and 7 ("Schizophrenia Genetics") make use of the analyses of behavior genetics more generally, and reductionism in explanations of behavior, to analyze some current work in the behavior genetics in humans. These chapters start with a discussion of temperament or personality types, and the instruments used to test personality -- for example, the Five Factor Model (FFM) analyses personality on the basis of "extraversion, neuroticism, agreeableness, conscientiousness and openness to experience," and neuroticism, extraversion, and openness are tested using the "Revised NEO-PI R" instrument (pp. 146-147). This leads to discussion of the DRD4 locus, which has been associated (though not consistently) with both novelty-seeking and depression; some of the variation may be due to complex interactions between that locus, other genes, and developmental environments (pp. 153-156).

It is this material that leads into one of the most interesting challenges to contemporary human behavior genetics: the techniques (especially "Genome Wide Association Studies" -- GWAS) that had been expected to find the genes associated with the proportion of variation in human behavioral traits thought to be 'heritable' (in the technical sense of the word) have, for the most part, failed spectacularly to do so. Massive searches for genetic variants associated with those variations in human behavioral traits that are highly heritable have failed to come up with much of anything at all. However, other techniques (e.g. "Genome-wide Complex Trait Analysis" -- GCTA) continue to support the high heritability of these traits suggested by more traditional (e.g. twin-based) quantitative genetics research.

It is the stark difference between the results of heritability studies and molecular studies that leads researchers like Eric Turkheimer to the "paradoxical outcome" that "personality is heritable, but it has no genetic mechanism" (p. 163, quoting Turkheimer et al. 2014). So understanding the relationship between heritability and molecular genetics remains a critical challenge to both proponents and critics of modern human behavior genetics.

Indeed, it is the first of Turkheimer's "Three Laws" of behavior genetics ("First Law. All human behavioral traits are heritable" 2000 160) that is perhaps most problematic for attempts to understand the relationship between genetic variation in humans and variations in human behavior. When one hears, for example, that contemporary estimates for the heritability of "major depression" are around 40% (that is, roughly, about 40% of the variance in the likelihood of someone's suffering from a major depressive episode at some point in their life is associated with genetic differences between individuals) (see e.g. Sullivan, Neale, and Kendler 2000; Kendler and Prescott 1999), it seems plausible that particular alleles, either by producing different proteins or by regulating other genes in ways that result in variation in the kinds or amounts of proteins produced, might for example change someone's brain chemistry in some subtle way, or change the way that particular neurons behave, and thereby change the chances that the person will suffer from the symptoms we associate with "major depression." Schaffner takes the reader through a few such possible genes and pathways, which, though still somewhat speculative, give the reader the feel for the methodologies involved and the challenges facing researchers (see e.g. pp. 156-160, on the 5-HTT and 5-HTTLPR regulatory genes, and the work on gene-by-environment interactions, and pp. 160-163 on the challenges of replicating these results). But as Turkheimer is fond of pointing out, telling a similar story about the heritability of "divorce" seems rather more problematic, despite "risk of divorce" also having a heritability of perhaps 40% (in some environments, at least -- see Jockin, McGue and Lykken 1996).

Certainly, one can partially avoid this difficulty by focusing not on the behavioral traits measured directly in these studies ("divorce," say) but rather on the "underlying" aspects of temperament (say) that one thinks influence the chances that one will get divorced (in a particular social environment, say). That is, no one (really) thinks that there are "divorce alleles," still less that there are thousands of them, each with a tiny additive effect on one's chances of staying married (on this topic, see Turkheimer's "Gloomy Prospect" blog, especially e.g. "Visscher et al on psychiatric genetics" 2011). But people do think that traits like those will be associated with more basic traits, and that (at least some) of these more basic traits will be stably associated with genetic variation (these more stable, lower-level traits are sometimes called "endophenotypes"). So Susan L. Trombetta and Irving I. Gottesman write of a "predisposition to form and maintain lasting pair bonds" and a "predisposition to have multiple mates over the life span" as "endophenotypes" for "marital status" (2000 254). With respect to schizophrenia, "candidate endophenotypes" include abnormalities in "sensory motor gating" (a kind of unconscious filtering process) and "eye-tracking," as well as cognitive endophenotypes such as "deficits in working memory", and Schaffner takes the reader through some of the possible pathways between candidate genes and these endophenotypes (pp. 194-195).

The chapter on schizophrenia ends with some (speculative) reflections on the role(s) that epigenetics may play in psychiatric genetics, pointing towards additional complicating factors for telling causal stories. In the end, after the two chapters on human behavior genetics, and the focus on schizophrenia, I suspect that many readers may find themselves a bit overwhelmed. The pathways between possible genes, changes in neurons and other cellular structures, proposed "endophenotypes," and the behaviors that we started out interested in are long, complex, and still little-understood. Schaffner's presentation reveals both the ways in which "partial" reductions -- explanations that make use of entities at many different levels, a variety of different kinds of mechanisms, and admit to a certain amount of 'gappiness' -- can be parts of a valuable and successful collection of research projects, but also seem to be a long way from the kinds of arguments about the relationships between behaviors and genes that human behavior geneticists used to, at least, push.

The last substantive chapter, "What's Genetic, What's Not, and Why Should We Care?" ties the discussion back to more traditionally philosophical concerns. After an analysis of some of the ways in which a trait's being "genetic" has been defined in the literature reveals, somewhat unsurprisingly, them all to be problematic, the discussion turns the old favorites: free-will and moral responsibility. When do discoveries about the relationship between genes and behaviors (say) undermine free-will? There are clearly some cases where knowledge of the genetic etiology of a 'behavior' has helped explained something about it; no one would blame the sufferers of multiple sclerosis, for example, for the typical tremors associated with the disease. But what conclusions follow from knowing that, for example, people with the "low-activity" (the short-form of the regulatory region) of the MAOA genotype are, if exposed to family violence as children, more likely to score highly on a variety of measures of "antisocial" behaviors than would children similarly exposed to family violence who have the "high-activity" MAOA genotype? Elsewhere, I have argued that, pace the conclusion of Avshalom Caspi et al's original article on this subject (that "these findings could inform the development of future pharmacological treatments" 2002 853), the most obvious conclusion is that a greater emphasis on preventing child abuse and spousal abuse is warranted (Kaplan 2007). Schaffner argues that, in any event, no plausible outcomes of contemporary human behavior genetics is likely to have any meaningful impact on any notion of free will or agency "worth having" (p. 129).

Schaffner takes a very particular approach to questions of how genetic variation might relate to behavioral differences, and stays focused on that approach. So for example, despite the similar title (and subject matter), he does not mention Helen E. Longino's recent Studying Human Behavior (2013); Longino's conclusions regarding the inevitability (and irreducibility) of pluralism, in both methodology and ontology, when studying human behavior are not, I think, strictly incompatible with the kind of partial reductions that Schaffner argues we might get from behavior genetics, but the approaches are different enough that it isn't entirely clear how they might fit together or where they might conflict. Explicitly addressing some of the other approaches philosophers have taken to these issues might better situate Schaffner's Behaving in the larger literature. But Schaffner picks his philosophical targets from a fairly narrow list, and unless one's interests align particularly well with his, one may be frustrated by the approaches that he doesn't address. I sometimes found myself wondering about whether the material he was presenting would fit into some of these other approaches that Schaffner doesn't address. However, it is also clear that no book on this subject could hope to be thorough, and that finding a way to present the material compellingly demands that one make choices.


Caspi A., J. McClay, T.E. Moffitt, J. Mill, J. Martin, I.W. Craig, A. Taylor, and P. Richie. 2002. "Role of genotype in the cycle of violence in maltreated children." Science 297:851 -- 854

Jockin, V., M. McGue, and D. T. Lykken. 1996. "Personality and Divorce: A Genetic Analysis." Journal of Personality and Social Psychology. 71(2): 288-299.

Kaplan, J. 2000. The Limits and Lies of Human Genetic Research, Routledge.

Kaplan, J. 2007. "Violence and Public Health: Exploring the Relationship Between Biological Perspectives on Violent Behavior and Public Health Approaches to Violence Prevention." Establishing Medical Reality: Essays in the Metaphysics and Epistemology of Biomedical Science edited by H. Kincaid and J. McKitrick. Springer: pp. 199-214.

Kaplan, J. 2015. "Heritability: a handy guide to what it means, what it doesn't mean, and that giant meta-analysis of twin studies." Accessed 8/7/2016

Kendler, K.S., and C.A. Prescott. 1995. "A Population-Based Twin Study of Lifetime Major Depression in Men and Women." Archives of General Psychiatry. 56(1):39-44.

Longino, H. 2013. Studying Human Behavior: How Scientists Investigate Aggression and Sexuality, University of Chicago Press.

Moss, L. 2003. What Genes Can't Do. MIT Press.

Sullivan, P.F., M.C. Neale, and K.S. Kendler. 2000. "Genetic epidemiology of major depression: review and meta-analysis." American Journal of Psychiatry 157:1552-1562.

Trombetta, S.L. and I.I. Gottesman. (2000). "Chapter 11: Endophenotypes for Marital Status in the Nas-Nrc Twin Registry." Pp 254-269. In Genetic inf1uences on human fertility and sexuality: theoretical and empirical contributions from the biological and behavioral sciences, edited by Joseph Lee, Rodgers, David C. Rowe, Warren B. Miller. Springer Science+Business Media.

Turkheimer, E., 2000. "Three laws of behavior genetics and what they mean." Current Directions in Psychological Science, 9(5), pp.160-164.

Turkheimer, E. 2011. "Visscher et al on psychiatric genetics." Accessed 8/6/2016.