Being Amoral: Psychopathy and Moral Incapacity

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Thomas Schramme (ed.), Being Amoral: Psychopathy and Moral Incapacity, MIT Press, 2014, 335pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262027915.

Reviewed by Jeanette Kennett, Macquarie University


Psychopathy is an endlessly fascinating disorder for philosophers and lay people alike. Thomas Schramme has collected 12 essays from leading researchers to explore the nature and implications of psychopathic amorality. The collection opens with an essay by Henning Sass and Alan R. Felthouse that focuses on the history and construct of psychopathy as a disorder. It argues that most of those who are called psychopaths would not qualify for a diagnosis of personality disorder on a traditional psychiatric understanding of the term, which requires patient suffering as well as social deviance. On Sass and Felthouse's mapping, psychopathy falls into the legal rather than the medical domain. The collection closes with an account from Susie Scott on the category of Dangerous and Severe Personality Disorder in which she describes the particular political, social and cultural context in the United Kingdom in which DSPD arose and the particular challenges to clinicians working with DSPD patients in this context.

The remaining essays focus directly on moral incapacity in the psychopath. Schramme provides a detailed overview of each essay in his substantial introduction; I will here pick out a few recurring themes and issues that will be familiar to philosophers working in the area.

According to the standard view that John Deigh challenges in his contribution on 'Psychopathic Resentment', resentment contains a moral judgment to the effect that we, or someone we identify with has been dealt an injustice. He cites Stephen Darwall: "resentment . . . is felt in response to apparent injustice, as if from the victim's point of view. . . . if you resent someone's treading on your foot . . . you feel as if he has violated a valid claim or demand" (210). Resentment on this account appears to require and reflect an understanding of oneself as a member of a moral community and as standing in relations of reciprocal obligation to others. Resentment felt in response to an agent's failure to meet his obligations to you implies that "one expects the same of oneself and is disposed to make similar demands on oneself" (212). So it looks as though it is not possible to be liable to resentment if you cannot take the viewpoints of others or see yourself as bound by the demands and reasons whose violation elicits resentment. Since psychopaths manifestly do not see themselves as members of a moral community bound by reciprocal obligations, they cannot be feeling resentment.

But Deigh argues that we cannot get away from the fact that psychopaths seem to feel resentment by restricting use of the term to "that species of anger that is moral in character" (212); that would make any representation of the liability to resentment as a mark of moral agency vacuous. In the (fictional) case he uses it is clear that the psychopath protagonist is not merely angry at being thwarted -- he is angry at being double-crossed. Deigh argues persuasively that the standard view of resentment in Anglo American philosophy is mistaken. A capacity for moral judgment is not necessary since someone entirely egocentric may be capable of the emotion. According to Deigh, P. F. Strawson recognized the need to distinguish between the personal reactive attitudes, which require only a degree of attachment to particular others (being 'mates' or 'pals'), and the vicarious reactive attitudes, which require that we are capable of understanding others interests sympathetically. Deigh's modified Strawsonian account goes further: he claims that the vicarious attitudes are "insufficient for understanding oneself as joined with others in relations of reciprocal moral obligation and for understanding, in consequence, the moral responsibility that can attach to failures to meet those obligations" (224). This understanding and the liability to self-reactive attitudes such as guilt are essential to the capacity for moral judgment, and it is these that the psychopath lacks.

Deigh's reading of resentment intersects with issues discussed in a number of other papers. For example Matthew Talbert's 'The Significance of Psychopathic Wrongdoing' argues that psychopaths are morally responsible in part because resentment or blame is an appropriate affective attitude towards them. Psychopaths can display ill will that is properly reflective of the agent's self. Their actions are guided by their judgments of their reasons. When those judgments reflect a contemptuous disregard of other's welfare they are an appropriate target of resentment. The appropriateness of resentment does not depend on the moral competence of the target -- psychopaths need only possess "general powers of rational agency" (279). Talbert may well be correct to argue that resentment is an appropriate response to psychopathic ill will. But if Deigh is right, Talbert moves too swiftly from the appropriateness of resentment -- a personal reactive attitude -- to the justifiability of moral blame. The general powers of rational agency might not be enough to ground moral responsibility if an essential class of reasons -- moral reasons -- is unavailable to the psychopath.

David Shoemaker argues that psychopathic moral incompetence can be traced to an inability to empathically identify with others. Psychopaths are thus insensitive to second person reasons. Other people do not ground reasons for them at all. Rather, their understanding of the requirements of morality is entirely rule based (and this is what explains the justifications they give for their answers on the moral/conventional distinction tasks). Shoemaker suggests that psychopaths' rule-based understanding of morality, while impoverished, meets the standards of criminal responsibility, though not of moral responsibility. His view of the issue might be justified on a consequentialist view of the purposes of legal punishment, albeit a view that is at odds with his Strawsonian account of moral responsibility. The law does not care why we obey it, and if psychopaths are capable of being deterred by the threat of punishment, then that is all that is required to justify punishing them. On this point Shoemaker might agree with Talbert that general powers of rational agency are sufficient at least for legal responsibility. Such a view is attractive,[1] but I think on balance that it is mistaken. The criminal law does care why we break the law; at this point our mental states become critical to an assessment of responsibility, and we are plausibly required to have not just knowledge of the rules but a degree of moral understanding.[2]

Piers Benn ('Not Caring: Sociopaths and the Suffering of Others') adopts the retributivist view of punishment and so doubts whether it could be just to punish someone who lacksmens rea. He argues that evidence of the significant gaps in the emotional responses and moral capacities of psychopaths are relevant for both moral and legal blame. There is an important distinction between ordinary anti-social people and psychopaths; those who lack the capacity for "empathic sympathy" cannot understand what is communicated via the participant reactive attitudes. On a retributivist account punishment this has an important moral expressive function. The criminal law does not just penalize, it condemns. It involves the kind of second person address that seems to require at least the possibility of uptake on the part of the offender.

The nature and role of rational deficits in the psychopath receives little direct attention in this volume, though both Deigh and Shoemaker adopt cognitively demanding accounts of what is required for full moral agency. Eric Matthews in 'Psychopathy and Moral Rationality' does focus on the irrationality of psychopaths. He points to the inappropriateness of the reasons psychopaths give for their behavior -- such as the man who beat a service station attendant unconscious because he did not want the inconvenience of going home for his wallet -- as suggesting a specific defect in practical reason in the psychopath. Matthews argues that a Kantian account is incapable of explaining such a defect and turns to Aristotle's ethics instead as grounding the view that actions can be rational only if they are done for good reasons and that good reasons for action must be intelligible in the light of a shared conception of our typically human needs. For this we need specific knowledge of our nature and circumstances rather than a general conception of rational governance that applies to all rational beings as such. He claims that our understanding of moral reasons for action and so our moral rationality is dependent in an Aristotelian way on human features such as the capacity for empathy.

This is not the place to set out a Kantian account of practical reason or of the deficits of psychopaths,[3] but it is unfortunate that Matthews' rejection of Kant appears to be based solely on a reading of the first version of the Categorical Imperative. Both the Formula of Humanity and the Formula of the Kingdom of Ends seem capable of establishing "maxims [that] are positively worthy" (82), and Kant's account of the imperfect duties makes explicit reference to our inevitable interdependence. The Doctrine of Virtue relates specifically to the human condition that Matthews accuses Kant of ignoring. For example Kant says: "man is regarded here not merely as a rational being but also as an animal endowed with reason. . . . humanity can be located . . . in the capacity and the will to share in others' feelings. . . . [this capacity] is free and is therefore called sympathetic; it is based on practical reason" (DV 457]), and

it is . . . an indirect duty to cultivate the compassionate natural feelings in us and to make use of them as so many means to sympathy based on moral principles . . . . for this is still one of the impulses that nature has implanted in us to do what the representation of duty alone would not accomplish. (DV457-8)

Kantian and Aristotelian views have much more in common than Matthews supposes.[4]

Lack or failure of empathy is undoubtedly the most popular diagnosis and explanation of psychopathic moral incompetence, and it is a thread in most of the papers. But what this amounts to is the key issue. The empathy explanation runs the risk of vacuity, which Deigh identifies in his discussion of resentment. Apparent consensus on psychopathic lack of empathy can mask crucial differences when 'empathy' becomes the label of choice for whatever it is that the psychopath lacks. Unclarity around what is meant by empathy can affect key debates in moral psychology. The empathy deficits of psychopaths have most often been taken to support a sentimentalist account of moral judgment (and an externalist account of moral motivation -- but see Walter Sinnott-Armstrong's essay in this collection on whether psychopathy refutes internalism and Schramme's essay arguing that it is inconceivable that a morally capable person can fail to care about morality). But whether this is the case will depend upon which conception of empathy is invoked and whether empathy plays the central role in morality that most sentimentalist accounts assume.[5]

Heidi Maibom highlights a number of problems in establishing that lack of empathy -- feeling what the other feels from their perspective -- is at the core of psychopathic amoralism. She argues that empathy is not sufficiently distinguished from "related, yet different, emotions and attitudes, including sympathy, emotional contagion, perspective taking, personal distress, emotional reactivity to others, general arousal, and social desirability" (96). Empirical measures of empathy, such as skin conductance responses to distressing pictures, only measure arousal, not valence, and probably capture personal distress rather than moral emotions of sympathy or compassion; self- report measures are sensitive to social desirability; and stereotyping and empathy scales measure a range of different emotional propensities and tend to conflate empathy and sympathy. Moreover, evidence that empathy produces helping behavior (the empathy-altruism hypothesis) is mixed, as is the evidence that empathy has an inhibitory effect on aggression. Maibom argues instead that a documented deficit in personal distress may play the key role in the moral deficits of psychopaths. Since psychopaths fail to experience personal distress when imagining themselves in unpleasant or frightening situations, their perspective taking produces neither personal nor empathic distress. Some degree of personal distress "may be involved in the ability to feel distress for others" (108), and it is this, Maibom suggests, rather than fellow feeling or sympathy that most likely plays a key role in inhibiting aggression.

The suggestion that psychopaths might lack what is sometimes called intrapersonal empathy (Maibom does not use this term) is not new, but characterizing this in terms of susceptibility to personal distress opens an interesting line of inquiry. Imagination is important for the kinds of cognitively sophisticated forms of empathy that might deliver moral understanding. Psychopaths' imaginations may be limited because their emotional experiences are limited. Nevertheless this can only be a partial explanation of moral incapacity. Other disorders involving impairments of empathy may not be similarly marked by incapacity to feel or imagine personal distress. Some accounts of narcissism do mention personal distress. Histrionic disorder involves high levels of personal distress, but the egocentric focus of the histrionic leaves little space for empathizing with others. Moreover, as Gwen Adshead points out in 'The Words but not the Music', those detained in secure facilities combine elements of psychopathy with "emotional dysregulation and distress" (118).

Adshead instead suggests that psychopaths may exhibit a form of alexithymia -- the inability to put feelings into words. She draws upon an examination of the narrative capacities of psychopathic inmates in a study of moral reasoning carried out by Jonathan Glover (2014) in Broadmoor. The interviewees display high levels of narrative incoherence, especially on moral questions, and seemed to find particular difficulty in applying a moral dilemma to themselves (What would you do in this situation?). Coherent narratives are high in self-reflection. By contrast a number of studies of psychopaths indicate that they violate maxims of relevance, contradict known facts about their lives without noticing it, and make huge unwarranted inferences. They cannot make their stories add up. But why not?

Kerrin A. Jacobs in 'Psychopathic Comportment and Moral Incapacity' draws upon Frankfurt's work on caring to diagnose the lack of structures that normally integrate individual decisions, overcome wantonness and provide a diachronic unity of the self. These two papers suggest that the core deficit in psychopathy may be a fragmented and impoverished sense of self. If this is right, it would leave psychopaths unable to experience those emotions that require diachronic unity of the self and inhibit emotional learning. Shallow affect and wantonness may go together.[6]

The provisional conclusion to be drawn from the papers in this valuable collection is that psychopaths do have some limited moral or proto-moral capacities and concerns. Nevertheless their impairments are substantial and pervasive, affecting both interpersonal relations and practical reason. While they undoubtedly have deficits in empathy, precisely how we should understand this and the extent to which their affective deficits explain their moral deficits or are themselves consequent on something more fundamental requires further investigation. Mapping these connections will shed further light on what is required for moral agency, moral community and moral responsibility.


Fine, Cordelia, and Kennett, Jeanette (2004). "Mental Impairment, Moral Understanding and Mitigation: Psychopathy and the Purposes of Punishment", The International Journal of Law and Psychiatry 27,5.

Glover, Jonathan (2014). Alien Landscapes?: Interpreting Disordered Minds, Harvard University Press.

Kant, Immanuel (1991). Metaphysical First Principles of the Doctrine of Virtue, in Mary Gregor (trans), The Metaphysics of Morals, Cambridge University Press

Kennett, Jeanette (2001). Agency and Responsibility: A Common-Sense Moral Psychology, Clarendon Press.

Kennett, Jeanette (2015). "What's Required for Motivation by Principle?." In Björnsson, G., Strandberg, C., Olinder, R. F.,  Eriksson, J., and  Björklund, F. (Eds.). Motivational Internalism, Oxford University Press.

Murphy, Jeffrie G. (1979). "Moral Death: A Kantian Essay on Psychopathy, Retribution, Justice, and Therapy Philosophical Studies Series in Philosophy", Volume 16, pp. 128-143.

Prinz, Jesse (2011). "Against Empathy", The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 49: 214-233. doi: 10.1111/j.2041-6962.2011.00069.x.

Sherman, Nancy (1997). Making a Necessity of Virtue: Aristotle and Kant on Virtue, Cambridge University Press.

[1] I have advanced it in the past. See Kennett 2001 pp. 209-14.

[2] See Fine and Kennett 2004.

[3] See Murphy 1972; Kennett 2015.

[4] See, e.g., Sherman 1997.

[5] Prinz (2011) is an exception among sentimentalists in joining the ranks of empathy sceptics.

[6] For an argument to this effect, see Kennett 2015.