Being and Number in Heidegger's Thought

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Michael Roubach, Being and Number in Heidegger's Thought, Continuum, 2008, 139pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847060303.

Reviewed by Stephan Käufer, Franklin & Marshall College


"Later investigations will reveal what I owe to my esteemed teachers of mathematics and physics; and I also will not let the influence of Professor Finke go to waste, who awakened the love and understanding for history in me, an unhistorical mathematician." So wrote Martin Heidegger in the preface to his 1914 doctoral dissertation, The Theory of Judgment in Psychologism. For all their breadth and depth the later investigations never do show much of an influence by the professors who taught Heidegger calculus and differential equations while he was enrolled in Freiburg University's Faculty for Mathematics and Natural Science. Rather it was the few courses Heidegger took during those years on neo-Kantian logic and epistemology that shaped his initial philosophical attempts. Nevertheless, Heidegger discusses topics of mathematics and the mathematical character of modern science in various guises in writings and lectures throughout his career. And since so much of his thought is devoted to ontology, it is an interesting question to what extent Heidegger's ontology is a mathematical ontology.

Michael Roubach has asked this question and the merit of his study is that it obliges the reader to go back to and re-read some of Heidegger's passages on mathematics from his dissertations, Being and Time, and lectures from the 1930s (Roubach devotes one chapter to each of these three). This is an interesting thing to do, so here are some passages Roubach cites, and a few he does not: The first chapter of Heidegger's 1915 Habilitation on "Duns Scotus' Theory of Categories and Meaning" consists of an Emil Lask-inspired interpretation of Thomas of Erfurt's Grammatica Speculativa, including a distinction of the unum transcendens from the number One. Being and Time section 3 mentions the crisis in the foundations of the sciences, including mathematics. Section 69b describes the decontextualizing and reordering of the understanding of entities that underlies natural science, which Heidegger here calls the "mathematical projection of nature". Sections 80 and 81contain the phenomenology of time-reckoning and, derivatively, of measuring time and counting. The 1935/36 lecture course on Kant's principles of pure understanding, Die Frage nach dem Ding (translated as "What is a Thing?"), contains, in section 18, a more elaborate analysis of the specifically mathematical character of modern physics and modern philosophy, and in section 27c an explanation of Kant's distinction between mathematical and dynamical principles. The 1938 essay "The Age of the World Picture" similarly argues that the mathematical character of modern science is grounded in the metaphysics of modernity that centers on the certainty of a self-knowing subject. The lessons that emerge from reading these texts are rather different from Roubach's suggestions. I say "suggestions," because Roubach limits himself to pretty general formulations: "At some of its most central junctures, Heidegger's thought crystallizes around the distinction between ontology and mathematics." In the early work we can detect such "reciprocal formative impact of ontology and mathematics." In Being and Time "mathematics, and particularly the interpretation of numbers, … constitutes an important interface between the various modes of interpreting time." It is hard to disagree with such claims, but also hard to agree with them.

One reason to welcome a book on Heidegger on mathematics is that it should help retire a pair of stale falsehoods: that Heidegger's philosophy, and so-called continental philosophy more broadly, is inimical to rationality, science, logic, and mathematics; and that commentators on Heidegger revel in and propagate such a rift. Unfortunately Roubach's book only has mixed success in undermining the second of these. He starts out by claiming that "most Heidegger scholars pay no attention whatsoever to Heidegger's understanding of mathematics". And in his chapter on Being and Time he claims that scholars generally interpret this work as "positing an absolute disparity between the sciences and mathematics, on the one hand, and the basic ontological framework, on the other." As a commentary on contemporary Heidegger scholarship this is false, and it reveals a basic, persistent flaw in Roubach's book. Roubach looks at Heidegger's various mentions of numbers and mathematics as evidence that Heidegger's ontology is structured by concepts taken from the science of mathematics. So, for instance, he claims that a conception of number structures Heidegger's analysis of Dasein's temporality, and that a version of mathematical intuitionism lies behind Heidegger's analysis of death and human finitude. But for Heidegger the mathematical, insofar as it is relevant for ontology, is never the numerical or plain old mathematics. From the Habilschrift onwards, Heidegger treats mathematics as an ontological structure that is more basic than the science of mathematics or its elements. As Heidegger says in The Age of the World Picture: "The essence of the mathematical is not determined by the numerical". Rather, the mathematical constitutes a feature of the projection of being that makes entities "learnable," i.e. regular and describable. In Die Frage nach dem Ding he writes: "That a mathematics of a certain kind could and had to come into play was a consequence of the mathematical projection". And in the course of distinguishing originary temporality from the derivative practices of reckoning with and measuring time, Being and Time makes clear that

the essence of concern with time does not lie in the use of numerical determinations in dating. What is existential-ontologically distinctive about time-reckoning may not, therefore, be found in the quantification of time but, rather, must be conceived more originarily in terms of the temporality of Dasein that reckons with time.

So it is indeed the case that an interpretation of the mathematical, though not of numbers, constitutes an important aspect of Heidegger's ontology. But it is not the case that Heidegger scholars have ignored this. Far from accepting or positing a disparity between Heidegger's ontology and the sciences, there are lively and productive debates about Heidegger's understanding of the mathematical projection underlying modern science. Joseph Rouse has written volumes on Heidegger's existential conception of science in Being and Time and Die Frage nach dem Ding. Other scholars, notably Steven Crowell and Wayne Martin, have studied Heidegger's dissertations and the influence of neo-Kantians such as Lask and Rickert on his early thought.

Roubach's book has other faults. His arguments occasionally confuse Heidegger's reports of other people's views with his own. For example, Heidegger says in the introduction to Being and Time that people generally distinguish temporal from non-temporal entities and that they put spatial and quantitative relations in the latter group. Heidegger calls this distinction "naïve" and challenges the understanding of time implicit in it; but Roubach writes that "Heidegger claims that numerical and spatial relations are 'non-temporal'" and he bases his interpretation of Heideggerian temporality on this claim. Similarly, Roubach presents Heidegger's analysis of Aristotle's distinction between number and measure as Heidegger's own; and he claims that since Heidegger diagnoses the modern epoch as fundamentally mathematical and traces this mathesis in Kant's ontology, he must himself be attempting a "project of mathematical ontology".

Roubach's analysis of Die Frage nach dem Ding is entangled in the common presumption that Heidegger's intellectual development underwent a radical break soon after Being and Time. The import of this "Kehre" and its reach into the particulars of Heidegger's views is often exaggerated. It is true that Heidegger largely abandons fundamental ontology, the systematic ambitions of Being and Time and the methodological priority of the analysis of Dasein. And it is also true that he begins to focus on the historical development of understandings of being and sees this history of being in terms of epochs. It is not clear, however, to what extent the infusion of historical epochs in this later approach implies a rejection of the views contained in the earlier writings; for the most part it does not. One area in which there is no radical change is Heidegger's conception of the mathematical projection of nature. Die Frage nach dem Ding and "The Age of the World Picture" give more detail than section 69b of Being and Time, but in this earlier text Heidegger already thought of the "ontological genesis" of mathematical physics as an "historical development". Another area in which no fundamental change is evident is Heidegger's interpretations of Kant. In the 1920s Heidegger focuses mostly on the transcendental deduction and the schematism chapter, while Die Frage nach dem Ding focuses on the analytic of principles. But these interpretations fit together into a single, overarching reading according to which the Critique of Pure Reason is a work in ontology, and not, pace the popular neo-Kantian approaches, an epistemology of the natural sciences.

Of course there are a lot of open and interesting questions about a Heideggerian ontology of mathematics proper, and also about Heidegger's indirect involvement in the formalist and intuitionist debates about the foundations of mathematics. Roubach makes intriguing suggestions about the influence of Cantor’s, Dedekind’s and Brouwer's work on Heidegger, and we know that at least early in his career Heidegger was fascinated by Husserl's project of the Philosophy of Arithmetic. But Roubach's book does not do enough to illuminate these connections, and it generally misconstrues their place in Heidegger's overall ontology. So we still have to wait for an interpretation of Heidegger's philosophy of mathematics; it will turn out to be a metaphysics of quantity that shows the numerical to be a necessary, yet derivative, articulation of the understanding of being.