Being and Reason: An Essay on Spinoza's Metaphysics

Being And Reason An Essay On Spinoza S Metaphysics

Martin Lin, Being and Reason: An Essay on Spinoza's Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2019, 200pp., $64.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198834151.

Reviewed by Yitzhak Y. Melamed, Johns Hopkins University


"To try to find out the reason for everything is very dangerous and leads to nothing but disappointment and dissatisfaction." With this zesty Queen Victoria quote Martin Lin opens the final chapter of his new book on Spinoza's metaphysics. In his introduction, Lin echoes Queen Victoria's admonition, warning the reader of the vices of over-confident rationalism that fails to realize that "the world is full of the contingent and the inexplicable" (2). While mostly sharing Lin's sentiment against hubristic rationalism, I have some reservations about his confidence that the vast terrain of the unexplained is also unexplainable. But let's not jump the gun.

Lin's book appears at a particularly exciting time when the study of Spinoza is flourishing and outstanding works -- such as Sam Newlands's recent book -- are coming into the light of day. Lin's text, which attempts to provide an account of the core of Spinoza's metaphysics, consists of seven chapters. The first chapter, addressing the geometrical method of the Ethics and its historical context, is followed by chapters on Spinoza's understanding of substance (Ch. 2), God (Ch. 3), attributes (Ch. 4), modes (Ch. 5), Spinoza's conatus doctrine and teleology (Ch. 6), and a final chapter on Spinoza's metaphysical rationalism. Throughout the book, Lin endeavors both to place Spinoza in his historical context and to put him in dialogue with contemporary metaphysics (and even quantum theory and modern physics (114)). The book is clear, well-written, and peppered with healthy self-irony. I enjoyed studying it. In the preface, Lin describes the book as the offspring of a crisis in which he considered turning his research attention from Spinoza to Leibniz (luckily, he didn't!). Part of this crisis seems to be Lin's reconsideration of his own early enthusiastic support of Michael Della Rocca's recent and bold interpretation of Spinoza as radical advocate of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (henceforth, PSR).[1] I found the book stimulating on many fronts, but in order to provide the high-resolution examination the book deserves, I will focus here mostly on two chapters: the book's longest chapter, on modes (partly because I had some role in the recent development of this topic), and the final chapter on metaphysical rationalism and the PSR. My discussion will also attempt to highlight and interrogate some crucial issues in the methodology of philosophy and its history.

Spinoza's Ethics opens with a series of definitions, one of which is that of a mode: "By mode [modus] I understand the affections of a substance [substantiaæ affectiones], or that which is in another through which it is also conceived" (E1d5).[2] The standard meaning of 'modus' in early modern Latin is a state, or a changeable characteristic. To avoid confusion, I will use (when needed) subscripts to distinguish between (possibly) different understandings of a concept (or term) by different authors and at different periods. Thus, 'propertySpinoza' will refer to Spinoza's understanding of property as proprium (a quality which follows necessarily from the essence of a thing but does not constitute the essence), while 'propertyours' will refer to our (much more generic) understanding of the concept of property (as roughly a characteristic, or a feature, of a thing).

Challenging the (almost) universal understanding of Spinozistic modes as inhering in substance and as properties (predicated) of the substance, Edwin Curley developed a reading according to which Spinoza's modes are neither states inhering in God, nor propertiesours predicated of God, but rather mere effects of God. Curley's motivation for developing his surprising interpretation stemmed from two sources. On the one hand, he argued that Spinozistic modes -- which include individuals such as you, me, the heaviest porcupine on earth, etc. -- seemed to be of the wrong logical type to serve as modes in the standard sense of the term.[3] On the other hand, Curley (and Lin) cite a cluster of three objections -- raised by Bayle in his 1699 Dictionnaire -- which Curley, and now also Lin, believe are devastating to Spinoza, if indeed he held that modes are properties inhering in, and predicated of, God, Spinoza's unique substance. Briefly, Bayle's three arguments are: (1) Spinoza is committed to the allegedly absurd view that God is the author of all sin, and thus is evil (Hitler inheres in God; hence, God is -- at least to some extent -- evil). (2) Spinoza is committed to the allegedly absurd view that God is changing (traditionally, modes are changing qualities; thus, God has changeable qualities). (3) Spinoza is committed to the absurd view that God is the subject of opposite qualities (if both the Turks and the Bulgarians are modes of God, then it would be true of God that he believes (God qua Bulgarian) and does not believe (God qua Turk) in Christ).

In 2009, I published a long article (which was latter incorporated into my 2013 book) in which I argued that Curley's thesis conflicts with numerous key texts of Spinoza, and that the "wrong logical type" objection employs a hermeneutics of domestication that tries to save Spinoza from himself by forcing on him views he never held.

Now comes Lin's new book which agrees with Curley (or more precisely, with what he and many of us considered to be Curley's view) that viewing modes as properties predicated of the substance is senseless (107) and "meaningless" (118). Lin also assigns much weight to Bayle's three arguments (105). Despite my great fondness for Bayle, I find his arguments very weak. I don't have the space to elaborate here,[4] but briefly: Spinoza would easily brush off Bayle's arguments as an attempt to enforce on him a debunked and anthropocentric  theology for which he had no patience.

Why does Lin think that modes cannot be properties predicated of the substance? His argument has two steps. First, Lin agrees with the view that if modes were "the metaphysical correlates of predicates" they would have to be universals (103). Then Lin argues -- rightly to my mind -- that Spinoza's modes are not universals because ultimately Spinoza is a nominalist. Therefore, Lin concludes, modes cannot be properties, either universal or particular. Lin does not provide textual support for his claim that (for Spinoza) predicates must be universal terms. It seems he does not even ask what Spinoza's understanding of predication is, and how Spinoza considers the relation between metaphysical entities and their linguistic/logical correlates.

So why should we assume with Lin (107) that it is senseless or meaningless for singular terms to occupy the predicate position (and that consequently modes cannot be properties)? Lin openly admits that on "a very natural reading," Spinoza's definition of modes as affections (1d5) shows that modes are properties (123). However, since viewing modes as propertiesours predicated of God is -- per Lin -- senseless, he turns to the principle of charity to avoid ascribing to Spinoza a nonsensical view. This, I assume, might explain Lin's completely ignoring a very significant body of key texts in which Spinoza treats modes as properties.[5]

Interpretive charity is justified when we are dealing with obvious typos. Personally, I would even consider employing a non-literal "charitable" reading of the text were I to find in Spinoza's work a claim such as: "2 is an odd number." In such a case, I would consider the possibility that Spinoza was using either '2' or 'odd number' in an idiosyncratic sense. Were I to do so, my first obligation would be to check systematically how Spinoza is using these two terms (and closely related terms such as 'even number', '4', etc.). The problem with Lin's methodology is that he does not examine Spinoza's own understanding of predication[6] and of propertiesSpinoza. Lin's only support for the claim that predicating singular terms is nonsensical are the assertions that (1) this was Aristotle's view (107), and (2) that per "the idiom of modern logic, singular terms cannot occupy predicate position" (104) This justification is problematic in numerous ways. Indeed, some Aristotle scholars (e.g., Owen) held that for Aristotle all accidents are repeatable. However, a recent and influential study by S. Marc Cohen describes this view as a minority view among current scholars and provides (what appears to me as) a quite powerful critique of that minority view.[7] Moreover, in his outstanding recent book on Aristotle's modal syllogistic, Marko Malink concludes that singular terms such as 'Mikkalos' can serve as "both subject and predicate" of categorical propositions.[8]

The situation is no better regarding current metaphysics and philosophy of logic. Here too, some are enthusiastically supportive, and others are highly critical, of tropes. Is there a consensus among current logic theorists that trope terms cannot be unary relations (a.k.a. properties)? I doubt it. If it were the case that the ban on predicating singular terms were universally agreed upon, I would expect trope theorists to be frantic -- they have no logic! -- to build an alternative to our standard FOL. My very distant impression is that current philosophers of logic are barely bothered by these issues. You need many additional premises in order for this issue to become a serious problem (e.g., you need to agree about your concept of predication and the extent to which metaphysical considerations put constraints on your logic).

Frankly, all these issues are still not the major problem with Lin's methodology. For even if it were undoubtedly true that Aristotle's logic (and current logic) rejects the possibility of predicating singular terms, why should we assume that Spinoza accepts this view (especially given the fact that his standard attitude toward Aristotle and the scholastics is highly critical)? Is the theory of tropes as nonsensical as the claim that "2 is an odd number"? I must confess that I have no problem understanding trope theorists (or the works of Cohen and Malink). Should we adopt from now on a new practice for winning debates (and interpreting dead philosophers): announce that your opponents' views are senseless, therefore -- given charity -- assume that they didn't mean what they said? I, for one, fail to see the philosophical value and attractiveness of this practice and methodology. Isn't Spinoza entitled to his own assertions even when they are radical, or erroneous?

The appendix to Lin's chapter on modes is a critical evaluation of my claim that in early modern philosophy the distinction between things and properties is not at all clear-cut (and that, as a result, claims such as "some things are also properties" are not as absurd as the claim that "some odd numbers are also even"). Lin discusses three, out of the dozen or so, sources I cite (Melamed 2013, 43-55). I don't have the space to address properly all three texts, but I'll respond to two of the three. Let's begin with the first text which appears in Descartes' Third Set of Replies.

I have also made it quite clear how reality admits of more and less. A substance is more of a thing than a mode; if there are real qualities or incomplete substances, they are things to a greater extent than modes, but to a lesser extent than complete substances; and, finally, if there is an infinite and independent substance, it is more of a thing than a finite and dependent substance. All this is completely self-evident. (AT VII 185, italics added)

In this passage, Descartes states explicitly that thinghood comes in degrees, and that real qualities (if they exist) are things to a greater extent than modes and to a lesser extent than substances. Note that per this passage, modes are things to certain extent, and there is no clear bifurcation between things and properties.

Against my use of this textual proof, Lin argues that I failed to realize that the passage I cited from Descartes is a response to "a parody" or a joke by Hobbes, and that therefore "it would be a mistake to read too much into it" (134). Well, let's look together at Hobbes' "joke" (as quoted in Lin 134):

Moreover, M. Descartes should consider afresh what 'more reality' means. Does reality admit of more and less? Or does he think one thing can be more of a thing than another? If so, he should consider how this can be explained to us with that degree of clarity that every demonstration calls for, and which he himself has employed elsewhere. (AT VII 186)

Is this passage a joke? I don't think so. The passage has a delicate sardonic tone, but so do numerous other pieces of serious philosophical polemics. Should we avoid "reading too much" into Plato's dialogues (or Nietzsche's works) due to their use of irony? Is Lin suggesting that we should adopt a new purist methodology in which irony is excluded from serious philosophical discourse? Notice that, even per Lin, Descartes' response -- which is the passage I have cited in my book -- contains no "parody." So why should we avoid using it? Is the presence of irony so contiguous that even being a response to a delicate irony prohibits a text from being treated as genuine philosophy?

Lin also criticizes my claim that on occasion Leibniz identifies a monad (a thing) and its haecceity (a propertyours). Lin argues that I make "a mistake in thinking of [Leibnizian] essences as properties" (136). In my book I consistently reserved the Latin terms 'propria' or 'proprietates' for the early modern notion of property whose extension is much more restricted than propertyours. Hence, I assume that Lin is not charging me with confusing essentia and proprium. He must then mean that it is wrong to describe Leibnizian haecceities as propertiesours. However, the view of monadic states and haecceities as propertiesours is completely standard in current literature. Lin is definitely entitled to reject this common view, but such assertion should be backed by argument.

The seventh and final chapter of Lin's book addresses the role of the PSR in Spinoza's philosophy, specifically targeting Della Rocca's claim that Spinoza's version of the PSR not only commits him to the explainability of everything, but that, ultimately, everything must be explained, indeed reduced, to reason (Della Rocca 2008). The chapter is a sharp revision of Lin's early endorsement of Della Rocca's claim, and I have much sympathy for his serious attempt at self-criticism. Moreover, in criticizing the view that Spinoza is committed to the universal explainability of every fact (and the rejection of any brute fact), Lin is taking on a view that was carefully thought out and defended by other towering scholars, such as Martial Gueroult and Don Garrett. Here again, I applaud his fresh thinking.

Lin accepts the claim that Spinoza affirms a variant of the PSR, roughly the assertion that there must be reason or cause both for the existence and for the non-existence of things (167). However, Lin adds, in Spinoza's system the PSR is a relatively unimportant claim and a far cry from the importance Leibniz ascribes to the principle: "Spinoza tucks his PSR away in alternative demonstration of E1p11, using it only once, to prove the necessary existence of God, never to mention it again" (166). Well, unfortunately, this assertion is simply untrue. The claim, "there must be, for each existing thing, a certain cause on account of which it exists," appears in E1p8s2 (II/51/28), and indeed is repeated and elaborated in E1p11d (II/52/30), Spinoza's second proof of God's existence. Since this proof is one of the most original, sophisticated, and contested demonstrations of the entire book, I would hesitate to describe it as "tucked away." Moreover, the PSR is also doing vital work in the first demonstration of E1p11d, since this demonstration relies on E1d7 ("It pertains to the nature of substance to exist"). The demonstration of E1p7 would not be valid without the PSR. The demonstration begins with the premise (established earlier) that (i) the cause for the existence of substance cannot come from outside, from which it infers (ii) the existence of substance must lie inside the substance. The inference from (i) to (ii) patently assumes that a substance must have a cause for its existence, i.e., it assumes the PSR. Without the PSR neither E1p7 nor the first proof for E1p11 would be valid. The geometrical order of the Ethics is cumulative, and no less than fourteen propositions cite explicitly E1p7 or E1p11 in their demonstrations. These fourteen propositions themselves are the grounds for numerous other propositions: little will be left of the conceptual edifice of the Ethics if the PSR is rejected.

Arguably, many other propositions in the Ethics assume the PSR tacitly in their demonstrations, but to establish this point would require careful reconstruction of each demonstration which cannot be carried out here. In his attempt to downplay the importance of the PSR for Spinoza, Lin argues that, contrary to the common view, Spinoza's necessitarianism -- as stated in E1p29 -- is not motivated by the PSR. This is an in interesting claim and Lin is right, I think, in pointing out that Spinoza's actual argument for E1p29 is different from the pretty direct inference from the PSR to necessitarianism that one finds in van Inwagen and Bennett (169). Still, Lin's assertion that the necessitarianism of E1p29 does not rely on the PSR is wrong. E1p29 relies explicitly on E1p26 ("a thing which has been determined to produce an effect has necessarily been determined in this way by God") which in its turn relies on the following premise: "that through which things are said to determine to produce an effect must be something positive (as is known through itself)" (E1p26d, italics added). For Spinoza, to produce x is to cause it to exist. In claiming that the cause of a thing's existence must be something positive, Spinoza is simply asserting that the cause cannot be nothing, i.e., that there must be a cause. Spinoza uses this terminology of positive cause in another formulation of the PSR in one of his early works:

Nothing exists of which it cannot be asked, what is the cause, or reason, why it exists . . . Since existing is something positive, we cannot say that it has nothing as its cause (by A7). Therefore, we must assign some positive cause, or reason, why [a thing] exists -- either an external one, i.e., one outside the thing itself, or an internal one. (I/158/3-8, italics added)

E1p26 relies on a statement of the PSR, and thus, E1p29 as well seems to be strongly dependent on the PSR.

Lin's book is interesting and stimulating, though sometimes it suffers from under-engagement with Spinoza's text. I am looking forward to continued engagement with this important work. Because Spinoza was a loner, both in life and in his philosophy, Spinoza's views may frequently appear odd and counterintuitive. Whether this is a virtue or a vice depends on one's expectations of good philosophy.


[1] Michael Della Rocca (2008). Spinoza. Routledge.

[2] Unless otherwise marked, all references to Spinoza's works are to Curley's translation. I use the standard system for referring to passages in the Ethics.

[3] E.M. Curley (1969). Spinoza's Metaphysics. Harvard UP, p. 18.

[4] For a detailed refutation of Bayle's arguments, see Yitzhak Y. Melamed (2013). Spinoza's Metaphysics. Oxford University Press, pp. 35-40. Lin argues that Spinoza is vulnerable to Bayle's "God as author of evil and sin" argument, because "by Spinoza's own lights" it is wrong to describe God as cruel or cowardly (109-10). However, Spinoza would indeed reject these two descriptions, but not at all because of their association with evil or any negative value. For Spinoza, describing God as merciful and courageous is not any better than ascribing cruelty and cowardice. He would reject all four descriptions due to their anthropomorphism.

[5] See, for example, E1p16d. Significantly, when Lin finally mentions Spinoza's explicit reference to modes as "properties [proprietates] that follow from the essence" of substance (E1p16d, italics mine), he paraphrases Spinoza's words, deleting "properties" and having instead "things that follow from the essence" (172, italics mine). For a variety of passages in Spinoza which support the conclusion that modes are properties, see Melamed 2013, pp. 20-1, 27-32, 50-53.

[6] Spinoza has quite a few interesting things to say about predication. In TIE §62 he claims that to have an idea is to have a "connection of subject and predicate." Presumably, we can have an idea of the inherence of a specific mode in God. What would then be the subject and predicate connected in this idea? In the KV, Spinoza repeatedly asserts that "all in all must be predicated of Nature" or God (I/22/10 and I/23/20). We can and should debate the interpretation of these passages, but they cannot be ignored if we wish to understand Spinoza's views on predication.

[7] S. Marac Cohen (2013). "Accidental Being's in Aristotle Ontology" in Reason and Analysis in Ancient Greek philosophy. Springer.

[8] Marko Malink (2013). Aristotle's Modal Syllogistic. Harvard UP, pp. 48-9.