Being and Truth

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Martin Heidegger, Being and Truth, Gregory Fried and Richard Polt (trs.), Indiana University Press, 2010, 236pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780253355119.

Reviewed by Miguel de Beistegui, The University of Warwick


The two lecture courses collected in the volume entitled Being and Truth were delivered during Heidegger's tenure as the first Nazi rector of the University of Freiburg and thus in his darkest hour as a philosopher. The lecture course The Fundamental Question of Philosophy was held in the Summer Semester of 1933. It is devoted to an exploration of the fundamental question of philosophy and its difference from what Heidegger calls the guiding question of philosophy, understood (and deconstructed) as the question concerning the beingness of beings. Its short, incomplete and largely programmatic state is most certainly due to Heidegger's responsibilities and duties as rector, which, according to the editor, must have forced him to cancel a number of lectures (it is unclear when the lectures began and ended).

The second lecture course, entitled On the Essence of Truth, ran between 7 November 1933 and 27 February 1934. Based on a thorough transcript by Wilhelm Hallwachs, it consists of a detailed exploration of the essence of truth (and untruth) and its connection with the question of Being. Yet, apart from its long introduction and numerous remarks regarding the historical and political situation of Germany, it repeats a lecture course of the same name from the Winter Semester of 1931-32 (GA 34).[1] As such, the volume's originality and importance lie not so much in its often sketchy or repetitive philosophical content as in the manner in which it relates that content to the historical and political situation facing Germany at the time. In that respect, it supplements Heidegger's already published political texts from 1933-34, including his rectoral address of 1 May, 1933.[2] Given the politically sensitive nature of those lectures and the room for possible mistranslations, I found the translation mostly accurate and reliable.

The Fundamental Question of Philosophy opens with a series of remarks concerning the new historical and political situation in Germany. From the start, and throughout the volume as a whole, it is a question of finding the point of intersection or articulation between the rise of National Socialism and the most fundamental and decisive question with which philosophy needs to concern itself. The German people (Volk), Heidegger claims, is now coming into its own, that is, finding a leadership or Führung that corresponds to its own essence. It is in the process of creating and shaping itself as a genuine state (Staat) and a nation (Nation), in the hands of which it has decided to deliver its fate (Schiksal). The fate or calling (Berufung) in question, indeed the mission (Auftrag) of the German people, is one of leadership within the world of peoples. The question with which Heidegger is concerned is one of knowing what the goal and mission of philosophy are in that context and at that particular moment. The goal of the course, we are told, is to "awaken the knowledge of this mission and root it in the heart and will of the people" (3/3) and to address the nature of this leadership.

Whilst subscribing entirely and enthusiastically to the new political order, whilst seeing in the rise of National Socialism the dawn of a new era for the German people and nation, rooted in the Führerprinzip, Heidegger raises the question of the origin and meaning of the principle in question. Does the historical mission and vocation of the German people consist solely of a blind obedience to the Führer, or does it require a genuine knowledge (Wissen) of this mission? The question concerning the "spirit" (Geist) -- that is, the true force and ultimate authority -- guiding the revolution and the German nation runs through the volume as a whole, and through the entire period of Heidegger's political engagement: "one no longer knows anything about what spirit is," he laments (7/6). It's in the name of that spirit that, long after he had resigned from the rectorship, Heidegger continued to invoke the "inner truth and greatness of National Socialism."[3]

Heidegger's aim and position in those two lecture courses can be interpreted in two different, equally valid and ultimately irreconcilable ways.

On the one hand, one can see him as putting Wissen -- which includes Heidegger's own philosophy, of course, but also the scientific and intellectual forces of the country as a whole -- at the service of the new ideology of race, blood, soil, struggle and domination. One can see Heidegger's call as relinquishing the independence and autonomy of the German university and subordinating it to the demands and worldview of the new regime, in short, as the Gleichschaltung of society as a whole, including its scientific community. This means, naturally, abandoning any questioning or critical standpoint vis-à-vis the regime and providing it with the (pseudo)-scientific justification it sought. It means justifying the unjustifiable.

Nowhere is such an attitude more visible (and more shocking) than in Heidegger's discussion of Heraclitus' fragment 53 (Diels) in the introduction to On the Essence of Truth. The fragment claims that "polemos [Kampf, struggle] is the father of all things." Whilst not necessarily involving the sense of military combat, Heidegger argues, polemos definitely carries the sense of enmity and struggle. This is the sense in which it differs from the friendly, competitive agon: "the struggle is in earnest; the opponent is not a partner but an enemy. Struggle as standing against the enemy, or more plainly: standing firm in confrontation [Auseinandersetzung]" (90/73). This initial statement is clarified in the following deeply disturbing passage, reminiscent of a letter Heidegger wrote in 1929, denouncing "the growing Jewish contamination" of "German spiritual life":[4]

An enemy is each and every person who poses an essential threat to the Dasein of the people and its individual members. The enemy does not have to be external, and the external enemy is not even always the more dangerous one. And it can seem as if there were no enemy. Then it is a fundamental requirement to find the enemy, to expose the enemy to the light, or even first to make the enemy, so that this standing against [Stehen gegen] the enemy may happen and so that Dasein may not lose its edge.

The enemy can have attached itself to the innermost roots of the Dasein of a people and can set itself against this people's own essence and act against it. The struggle is all the fiercer and harder and tougher, for the least of it consists in coming to blows with one another; it is often far more difficult and wearisome to catch sight of the enemy as such, to bring the enemy into the open, to harbor no illusions about the enemy, to keep oneself ready for attack, to cultivate and intensify a constant readiness and to prepare the attack looking far ahead with the goal of total annihilation (90-91/73).

One could not imagine a more unambiguous apology of violence and annihilation. The historical context of those remarks is of course of the utmost importance, insofar as the internal enemies of the Reich, against which laws had already been promulgated and persecution initiated, were clearly identified in 1933. Who could Heidegger have in mind when uttering those words, if not the designated internal enemies of the Reich -- the Jews, first and foremost, but also the Gypsies, the communists and all the opponents of the regime? There is nothing in what Heidegger wrote or said that can counterbalance or nuance the hatred and even incitement to murder displayed in those remarks. They are an indelible stain on his thought and life. Heidegger extends this ideology of war and struggle -- which has little to do with Heraclitus' fragment -- to "beings as a whole." Struggle, Heidegger claims, "determines [beings] in a crucial way" and "encompasses and permeates all" (91/73). As a result, "wherever no struggle reigns, standstill, leveling, equilibrium, mediocrity, harmlessness, decline, fragility and tepidity, decay and collapse, in short: passing-away [Vergehen]" (92/74).

On the other hand, one can see Heidegger as making genuine leadership dependent on an adequate understanding of the spiritual mission and the historical destiny of the German people, that is, as defending Wissen as the true and fundamental principle of leadership in the new Germany. There is no doubt that the Nazi leadership wanted the former -- that is, the total alignment and unconditional support of German academics and scientists. There is also no doubt that, initially at least, Heidegger saw his role, that of his own university as rector and that of the German university as a whole, as one of enthusiastic support. But there is also little doubt that, by opening up that space of philosophical questioning -- the space of "spirit" -- beneath or prior to the blind faith in the regime, as a condition of his own support he was also developing an ambiguous if not ambivalent relation to National Socialism and planting the seeds of his own disillusion with the regime.

This is made clear from the start: the knowledge of the historical mission of Germany, which the lecture course seeks to awaken, does not consist solely in "becoming aware of the political situation of the German people today" (4/3), of embracing the worldview and rhetoric of National Socialism, however enthusiastically. Rather, it consists in "the demanding knowledge of that which must be before all else and for all else" (4/3). In a way, this makes matters worse, as it binds the fate of philosophy itself with that of National Socialism. But there is no doubt that, in Heidegger's mind, philosophy, understood as Wissen of what comes before all else, is the "highest spiritual mission" and "action" in the most decisive sense. This ambiguous, conditional support is perhaps best expressed at the very end of the second lecture course, where Heidegger embraces the ideology of blood and soil, but only to subordinate it to the genuine forces of knowledge and spirit:

Today, there is much talk of blood and soil as forces that are frequently invoked … Blood and soil are indeed powerful and necessary, but they are not sufficient conditions for the Dasein of a people.

Other conditions are knowledge and spirit, but not as an addendum to a list. Knowledge first brings a direction and path to the blood's flow, first brings to the soil the fecundity of what it can bring to term. (264/201; my emphasis)

Heidegger's remarks from 30 January 1933 in the second lecture course -- remarks that he developed as a response to a speech given the day before by Kolbenheyer[5] on "The Value for Life and Effect on Life of Poetic Art in a People" -- throw further light on his own interpretation and specific version of National Socialism. It is one that is rooted not in biologism, that is, in a conception of the Being of the human being as life and on the biological reality as "the only definitive reality," but in a spiritualism emanating from the ultimate reality of will, fate, destiny and freedom. What Kolbenheyer fails to see, Heidegger claims, is that "man as people is a historical entity, that to historical Being there belongs the decision for a particular will to be and fate -- engagement of action, responsibility in endurance and persistence, courage, confidence, faith, the strength for sacrifice" (210/160). To a materialist conception of history based on life -- or on socio-economic forces for that matter -- Heidegger opposes the heroism and voluntarism of the people, its resoluteness in embracing and affirming its own essence and destiny (which, in Heidegger's misguided imagination, consisted in the possibility of reviving the grounding and forgotten inception of Western history in Greek thought) and the total transformation of itself, away from bourgeois, liberal values and thought.

The decisive question, then, concerns the precise meaning of "knowledge" and "spirit" and the extent to which they exceed the very worldview and ideology to which Heidegger was also subscribing in 1933-34.

As defining "that which must be before all else and for all else," knowledge is essentially knowledge of the a priori, that is, philosophy. But what is the a priori? The a priori is what Heidegger calls "Being" or "truth" (and much of the two lecture courses consists in showing how the question of Being is indeed the question of truth: how, when properly formulated, the question of Being is indeed the question concerning the essence of truth); it defines the essence and the fundamental question (Grundfrage) of philosophy. This, in turn, means that the fundamental question of philosophy -- the question concerning the essence of truth -- is the force that is to guide Germany through this time of upheaval. It is only at the cost of a genuine confrontation or coming to grips with the fundamental question that the German people can become equal to the momentous historical task and mission awaiting it. Once again, this dream signals at once the greatest stain on Heidegger's thought -- since Heidegger sought to justify the actions and words of the Nazis by rooting them in the worthiest and most fundamental philosophical question -- and the inevitable divorce with National Socialism -- since it soon became apparent that its anti-Semitic, imperialistic and nihilistic core could hardly be mistaken for the sort of event and turning that Heidegger wanted it to be.

Underlying the question of philosophy itself is that of the extent to which, and the manner in which, philosophy can itself be in power, that is, politically decisive and active. In that context, it should come as no surprise that Heidegger decides to return at length to the philosophical text that first broached that question and set up the terms of the confrontation between philosophy and politics, or between the question of truth and the ideal city, namely, Plato's Republic. Commenting on the allegory of the cave in On the Essence of Truth, Heidegger notes that the philosopher is the one who, through the ascent out of the cave, knows and sees what is light and what is shadow, what is true reality (the idea) and what is semblance (§24), what is most unconcealed (alethinon), or what most is (ontos on) and what is disguised. But the genuine philosopher is also, and above all, the one who climbs back down into the cave and allows the cave dwellers to climb the steep path that leads to the contemplation of the true light and the realm of ideas. This movement, Heidegger claims, amounts to a historical transformation. In fact, it is "the happening of history itself" (183/141) and the highest historical task for a people -- the very task that, in his own Platonic blindness, Heidegger saw Germany under National Socialism as needing and willing to carry out. This extraordinary lack of lucidity is perhaps best expressed in the following passage:

Taken in the usual sense, one who rules in the state must be a philosopher. This naturally does not mean that professors of philosophy should become Reich-chancellors -- that would be a disaster from the start. But it means that the people who are endowed with the rule of the state must be philosophizing human beings. Philosophers, as philosophizing human beings, have the task and function of phulakes, guardians. They have to be on guard to make sure that rulership and the state's ruling structure are thoroughly under the sway of philosophy -- not as some system, but as a knowing that is the deepest and broadest knowledge of man and man's Being (194/149; my emphasis).

Towards the end of the same lecture course, Heidegger compares the Greek world and the "liberation of man to the essence of his Being" it managed to bring about through the creation of the Greek state, religion, art, architecture and philosophy with the creation of the National Socialist state. According to Heidegger, a similar "projection of world" (Weltentwurf) and "total transformation" was under way in 1933-34: "National Socialism is not some doctrine, but the transformation from the bottom up of the German world -- and, as we believe, of the European world too" (225/172). There is no doubt that National Socialism turned the German world, and the European world too, upside down, only in a way that turned out to be very different from the one Heidegger had hoped and predicted.

Before turning to the fundamental question of philosophy as the most demanding question for the German people, Heidegger asks about the resolve that is necessary in order to pursue such a question. This is because, more than a merely academic question, it is a matter of fate:

The question of the essence of truth has nothing to do with pitting some scholarly theory of the concept of truth against some other theory, nor with supporting some philosophical standpoint against another. We have neither desire, nor time, nor need for this. Rather, the question has to do with this alone: actively coming to grips, with the moment of world history into which the spirit of this earth has entered. Everything else is superfluous, a waste of time. (119/94)

The question of the essence of truth is not ahistorical or suprahistorical. It determines and defines history as fate. So the crucial question with which the German people as a whole is confronted is whether it wills that essence: "whether we as a people still will ourselves, or whether we no longer will ourselves" (14/11), "whether we will the greatness of our people," "whether we will to create the spiritual world that is still latent in the happening that is now coming to be in the events that are currently unfolding [im jetzt werdenden Geschehen] -- or not" (7/6). Throughout the two lecture courses, Heidegger tries to awaken an "essential courage for ourselves," for "our Dasein in the midst of the world," for "beings as a whole" -- in short, the courage for what is "one's own," the courage for one's own essence. The volume is shot through with historical heroism and voluntarism.

The courage in question is precisely what will allow "us" to engage in a thoughtful confrontation with the origins of our own history, and thus with the possibility of a genuine destiny. In both lecture courses, the German Dasein is thought in relation to that of the Greeks and the inception (Anfang) of philosophy. The German Dasein and destiny is envisaged as repetition of the Greek beginning: "the Greek people, whose ethnicity [Stammesart] and language have the same provenance [Herkunft] as ours" (6/5). As a result, "harkening back [zurückhören] to this Greek inception" is "the deepest necessity of our German Dasein" (89/71); this reiteration of the Greek beginning is not with a view to "complete Greek civilisation, but rather fully to draw on the fundamental possibilities of the proto-Germanic ethnic essence [die Grundmöglichkeiten des urgermanischen Stammeswesens auszuschöpfen] and to bring these to mastery" (89/71). The beginning or inception is philosophy; philosophy is the emergence of history. But philosophy is not the provenance. What is the provenance? Provenance is essence, or the a priori.

It is by looking at Hegel's philosophy, and developing a genuine confrontation with it, Heidegger claims in SS 1933, that we will be able to enter the question of the essence or provenance of philosophy and confront our own history. Why Hegel? Because his philosophy is the completion of the history of philosophy and its turning point, marked by the emergence of the two dissident voices of Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. Unfortunately, Heidegger does not carry out his initial plan, and the confrontation with Hegel is only sketched very briefly at the very end of the lecture course. More interesting (and developed) are his remarks regarding the presuppositions of modern, and specifically Cartesian, metaphysics, which, far from signifying a new beginning for philosophy, actually marked "the beginning of a further essential decline of philosophy" (39/32).

Heidegger criticises the primacy of method -- as essentially oriented towards truth understood in a mathematical sense, that is, as what can be learned and taught -- in modern philosophy and in Descartes's philosophy in particular. Descartes introduces systematic doubt as the method to bring about something indubitable, that is, certain, and the presentation of certainty as the essence of truth: "Descartes's founding of philosophy [is] guided by the mathematical-methodical idea of knowability and certainty in general" (45/36). Knowability now defines the being of what is held up in advance as worthy of questioning. Heidegger's critique is that of the transformation of philosophy as epistemology, rooted in a metaphysics of consciousness (the "I") or the mind as the ultimate reality. The problem with such a "predominance of the mathematical conception of method," however, "is that it nips the fundamental question of philosophy in the bud" (46/36). Heidegger's thought since Being and Time was devoted to the reawakening of this forgotten question, and this is the question Being and Truth takes up again.

On the Essence of Truth opens up the question of truth and the essence of philosophy via a confrontation with the Greek beginning, and with the Platonic conception of truth in particular. After a long introduction, Heidegger turns to the first of his two remarkable analyses of Plato's text, namely, to the allegory of the cave in Plato's Republic. Heidegger's overall aim is to show that the allegory stages the confrontation (Auseinandersetzung) or struggle (Kampf) between two conceptions of truth, namely, truth as unconcealment (aletheia) and truth as correctness (homoiosis), and that Plato's philosophy as a whole is nothing but the struggle between these two conceptions. His fundamental claim is that the outcome of this struggle determined the spiritual history -- but this means history as such for Heidegger -- of the following millennia. The bold and radical claim, then, is that European history is the history of Spirit, and that the fate of Spirit is itself played out in the struggle opposing two different conceptions of truth. The issue is not between two definitions of truth, but the opposition between two fundamental positions in the history of humanity: European history is the history of the concept of truth. The happening of history, liberation from semblance and untruth and the ability to distinguish between Being and seeming, is a constant "struggle" and "confrontation," the struggle and confrontation of truth itself, which always takes place as a confrontation with and a wresting from, "concealment in the sense of disguise [Verstellens] and covering up [Verdeckens]" (184/142).

To say that philosophy, as the genuinely liberating activity and thus as the happening of history, consists in the ability to distinguish truth from untruth is not, however, to leave untruth behind once and for all. For truth and untruth aren't two separate spheres. Rather, "man exists in the truth and in untruth, in concealment and unconcealment together," and this in such a way that "standing in the truth is always confrontation [Auseinandersetzung], an act of struggle [ein Kämpfen]" (185/142). The distinctive feature of Heidegger's interpretation is its emphasis on this co-belonging of truth and untruth. There is, Heidegger insists, no pure and definitive unconcealment, but only a process of unconcealment to which semblance, disguise and the covering-up of things -- in short, untruth -- essentially belongs. This, he claims, is the decisive conclusion that needs to be drawn from Plato's image of the cave and from his philosophy as a whole: "untruth belongs to the essence of truth" (187/144). This means that truth must be torn out of concealment, wrested from it, continuously. It also means that truth is not something that we possess, nor something that is primarily opposed to falsehood.

When reading Heidegger's political statements, which frame and punctuate his otherwise thought-provoking philosophical analyses, one is struck by their radicalness: the level of compromise is staggering and at times intolerable. But what is most striking, ultimately, is Heidegger's utter blindness with respect to the true nature of an odious and destructive worldview and his systematic yet delusional projection of a profound transformation of Europe's destiny and a new dawn into the darkest episode of German history. For let us not forget, in the end, that the true spirit of National Socialism was exposed in Mein Kampf and realised in total destruction and genocide. There was and never will be any truth and greatness of National Socialism, not even that of Heidegger's private, idiosyncratic and in many ways purely fantasized version.

[1] See Vom Wesen der Wahrheit. Zu Platons Höhlengleichnis und Theätet (WS 1931-32), ed. Hermann Mörchen (Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 1988; rev. edition, 1997); and The Essence of Truth: On Plato's Cave Allegory and "Theaetetus," trans. Ted. Sadler (London and New York: Continuum, 2005).

[2] Translations of the texts in question can be found in Richard Wolin (ed.), The Heidegger Controversy (Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press, 1993), 29-60, and Manfred Stassen (ed.), Martin Heidegger: Philosophical and Political Writings (London & New York: Continuum, 2003), 1-18.

[3] On the notion of "spirit" and its complex history within Heidegger's thought, see J. Derrida, Of Spirit: Heidegger and the Question (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1990).

[4] See Letter to Victor Schwoerer in Martin Heidegger, Philosophical and Political Writings, 1.

[5] According to the editor, Erwin Guido Kolbenheyer was a widely read writer and spokesman for the National Socialist regime.