Being, Essence and Substance in Plato and Aristotle

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Paul Ricoeur, Being, Essence and Substance in Plato and Aristotle, David Pellauer and John Starkey (trs.), Polity, 2013, 266pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745660554.

Reviewed by Pol Vandevelde, Marquette University


This is the translation of a course that Paul Ricoeur taught at the University of Strasbourg in 1953-1954 and several times since then. It circulated in a mimeographed version made at the Sorbonne in 1957 and was published as a course in 1982. The French edition by Jean-Louis Schlegel appeared in 2011. Several other courses will become available electronically in the near future.

There are three main benefits in the publication and translation of this course. The first is Ricoeur's genuine contribution to the scholarship to Plato and Aristotle. This course represents his most detailed discussion of two philosophers who have remained his discussion partners until the end. Ricoeur sets for himself a long-term and a short-term goal. The long-term goal is rather ambitious and would make many commentators uncomfortable by its breadth. It is nothing less than "to work out the ontological foundations of our Western philosophy, so as to understand its intention by way of the history of its beginning" (p. 1). The short-term goal is more manageable. He wants to have a debate between Plato and Aristotle about being, essence, and substance, but against the traditional view at Ricoeur's time that Plato is a philosopher of essence and Aristotle a philosopher of substance. If we look beyond Platonic essentialism and Aristotelian substantialism, we see, Ricoeur argues, that they share a common ground.

This comparison is divided into two parts, one on Plato and the other on Aristotle. The part on Plato contains three sections on "'True being' or the Idea," "The Idea of Being and Non-Being," and "Being and the 'Divine.'" Ricoeur wants to show that Plato's ontology is pluralist. Being is "essentially discontinuous" to the extent that it gives itself in multiple ways, in different beings. In a chapter titled "Essence and Language," Ricoeur shows the influence of Cratylus on Plato in the analogy between the problem of essence and the problem of naming. To ask what virtue is amounts to asking what we call virtue. Ricoeur then examines two questions: first, in what sense is the essence what founds the word?; second, what do we learn about essence from the act of naming?

In an interesting discussion in several chapters, Ricoeur examines the questions raised in several dialogues, for example Parmenides, Sophist, and Timaeus, and the extent of their success in answering them. Ricoeur discerns two layers in Plato's ontology. The theory of ideas and their link to particulars through a "vertical" participation represents the first, most obvious layer. The second layer is less obvious and more radical. It concerns the very being of ideas themselves, given that they "are," and the kind of "lateral" participation they have in other ideas.

Because of the Socratic issue with language, Plato's philosophy, Ricoeur argues, is a "philosophy of intelligible determinations" (p. 111) and, thus, as commonly presented, an "essentialism." Yet, it is not a philosophy of being, but rather of "beings" so that there is the need to hold together the multiplicity of beings under the One or the Good, which are themselves beyond essence, thereby escaping discursive language. Plato's essentialism is thus encompassed by a concern about "substance." Thus, even though Plato provides an ontology of essence, he also points out the limits of such an ontology, for example, through the need for a "non being" that has to serve as a mediation between beings and the being those beings have. What he offers is at the end an unfinished ontology, which is rich in many insights, but whose systematic version will only come later with someone like Plotinus. Plato, Ricoeur somewhat provocatively writes, "wanted to do nothing more than compose dialogues" (p. 111).

The third section "Being and the 'Divine'" draws the consequence of this unfinished ontology. It is unfinished because ideas, for example, both subtend the sensible world, providing it with intelligibility, and are also themselves in need of being. This leads Ricoeur to show the connection between Plato's epistemological concerns about ideas, the one, being, non-being and religion. It is not religion as such that interests Ricoeur, but rather how philosophy itself in Plato "recharges itself from the Sacred" (p. 115). Ricoeur wants to highlight the "religious index" in Plato's combination of reason and ontology.

In the second part on Aristotle, Ricoeur wants to show that his ontology of substance is not a simple antithesis to Plato's essentialism, but is in some way of continuous with it, with specific and crucial differences. The part has two sections: "Being as Being" and "Being and Substance." Ricoeur devotes much attention to the Metaphysics. In one chapter he follows Werner Jaeger's genetic interpretation in an effort to go beyond the systematic order of presentation and uncover the historical development of Aristotle's views. Such a reconstruction of the genesis of Metaphysics allows us to see the kind of problems Aristotle tries to solve and the difficulties he has to deal with. Following Jaeger, Ricoeur reminds us that, although we do not have the works of Aristotle's Platonic period, there was a genesis of his mature views in the twenty years he spent with Plato. However, going beyond Jaeger, Ricoeur wants to put the genealogical method at the service of the systematic order so that the historical "dismembering" of Metaphysics (p. 148) allows us to see significant nuances in Aristotle's traditionally accepted views, for example, on substantiality, matter, and individuation.

Regarding substantiality, Ricoeur shows that what ultimately constitutes the substance is not matter, but rather form. This is a close connection with Plato. Although Aristotle starts with the substance in the physical world, the topic of the sensible is approached only as one component of the analysis of being or as one step between the examination of being as being and the analysis of a supreme substance. Thus, despite his starting point in concrete substance, Aristotle reaches Plato's ontological ground when he asks about the on he on, the being as being.

Regarding matter, Ricoeur uses some French commentators, such as Jean Marie Le Blond, to point out that matter is not really the purely undetermined or the unknowable substrate, but rather a relative term. In Aristotle's model of fabrication, matter is the least determined -- for example wood -- when correlated to the most determined -- for example, bed. This also means that matter is not inert, but linked to potency, so that matter "has the same signification as the organ does with respect to function" (207). Matter desires form, as stated in Physics I 9.

Regarding individuation, Ricoeur shows that Aristotle's understanding of reality as what is definite and determined does not amount to equating substance with an individual entity. A substance is knowable through its form, but the singular is "undetermined" (p. 234) for Aristotle, precisely to the extent that it is not universal and thus not fully intelligible. Aristotle, Ricoeur argues, manifests an "indifference to the singularity of individuals" (p. 148). As a consequence, what is most real in an individual is its essence and not so much its existence, for which, Ricoeur contends, Aristotle does not really have a theory. Rather, he "is driven back to the side of a philosophy of quiddity and not of the individual" (p. 234) and remains, like Plato, "a philosopher of intelligibility" (p. 148). Ricoeur concludes: "His philosophy of ousia, of beingness, of étance, oscillates between a Platonic philosophy of the Form and an empiricist philosophy of the concrete understood as an 'act' mixed with potentiality" (p. 236). This explains why ousia is both (and has been translated as) substance and essence. It is a "de-existentialized ousia" (p. 249).

As he did with Plato, Ricoeur shows that what is at the core of the difficulty is the unstable status of being. In Plato it was, among other things, the ambivalence of the idea as what confers being on the sensible and as what is still in need of being. In Aristotle it is the tension between essence, which makes the individual intelligible, and existence, which gives individuation to the entity, but no intelligibility and thus no real ontological status. Ricoeur argues that theology is in fact the ultimate realization of the ontology of being as being. This entails that the causality at stake in the first mover is a causality of the quiddity and not of the existence. If God is the cause of the world, it is the cause of "that which the world is," not of "why the world 'should be'" (p. 249). As Ricoeur repeats Étienne Gilson's views, the notion of an existence different from ousia will be brought about by the "theologies of the Old Testament" (p. 249).

Besides the benefit of presenting Ricoeur's own contribution to the scholarship on Plato and Aristotle, this course also offers a second, more historical benefit in two respects: regarding the sources Ricoeur uses and regarding the kind of scholarship he practices. He never made significant changes to the version of 1953-54, so the course does not reflect the immense production of secondary literature and the progress of scholarship on these philosophers. However, the dated scholarship of Ricoeur is also an historical testimony to the 19th and early 20th century commentators who have played a central role in how Plato and Aristotle were understood in French speaking countries until the 1960s. Such commentators as Brémond, Brochard, Diès, Festugière, Goldschmidt, Le Blond, Auguste Mansion, Suzanne Mansion, Robin, or Rodier may not be broadly known in American circles. In this regard, Ricoeur's course contributes to the history of the reception of Plato and Aristotle.

This course also has a historical interest in that it illustrates a certain, more continental kind of scholarship, in which a philosopher like Ricoeur discusses two major philosophers and addresses three fundamental issues: being, essence, and substance. This kind of "epic" scholarship obviously has the drawback of being somewhat general and sacrificing the detailed analysis of specific passages. It may appear even suspicious to the highly specialized brand of philosophical inquiry that is more typical in the Anglo-American academic world. However, there is something refreshing and stimulating in such a scholarship in the epic mode. First, it offers a real confrontation and debate, an Auseinandersetzung with two philosophical projects or programs in order to identify the real point and import of these questions about being, essence or substance; and, second, this kind of scholarship reminds us why we in fact care about these issues and what is really "current" or "actual" about them.

The third benefit of the publication and translation of this course concerns Ricoeur's own philosophy. By presenting in detail how he understands the fundamental ontological project of Plato and Aristotle, he helps us understand better the use he makes of Plato and Aristotle in his later works. For these philosophers were at the basis and often at the center of his studies of issues, such as time, action, the self, memory, and the good life. For example, in The Course of Recognition and in Memory, History, Forgetting, Ricoeur uses the Greeks and especially Plato and Aristotle in order to introduce the issue and sketch the history of the problem he wants to address. On several occasions, he also makes a rather creative use of these philosophers. A striking example is offered by his theory of narratives, which may represent the most original and fruitful manner of bringing together Plato and Aristotle. The very notion of narrative comes from Aristotle's reflection on tragedy in Poetics. Emplotment is what brings the multiplicity of what happens to a unity of sense. Ricoeur combines this notion of emplotment or narrative with what he calls the three "great kinds" -- the Same, the Other, and the Analogous -- which he interprets as ideas that work as meta-categories, transcending the first-order categories, such as person and thing. Although he acknowledges that the Analogous is not in Plato, he finds it in Aristotle's Rhetoric with the same "transcendental" role as the Same and the Other. Ricoeur uses these three kinds in the third volume of Time and Narrative as a test for the naïve notion of the past as "what really happened." We can vary the past according to "the Same," and we have what historiography aims at: to recover the past as it was. We may also vary the past according to "the other," and we have narratives, which are of a different nature and a different order than facts and events. We can also vary the past according to "the Analogous," and we have what is recounted as what can "stand for" the past and serve as a stand-in or as a représentance of what happened. In such variations, the three Platonic "kinds" or meta-categories confer on narratives a quasi ontological status -- a narrative "stands for" an action -- and move the debate about the past beyond a simple opposition between the narrative as "being" the past or the narrative as "not being" the past.

In Oneself as Another, Ricoeur presents another combination of Plato and Aristotle in order to elaborate the notion of selfhood. From Aristotle Ricoeur borrows the notion of character, ethos, in order to bring out the import in selfhood of being in representation or engaging in the world with others. He draws heavily from the Nicomachean Ethics in order to build his own views on the good life, the ethical aim, the virtue of being just, etc. What Ricoeur uses most efficiently is Aristotle's view that change and movement are a being in potentiality and thus are not extrinsic to being or non-being. Ricoeur combines this view with the Platonic meta-categories and the dialectic of the same and the other. He can then articulate the possibility for the self to change in the course of time -- becoming other (on the side of Plato's alterity) or a substance that "has to be" (Aristotle), while remaining the same. This is Ricoeur's own dialectic between ipseity and alterity, in which dialectic the changes that the self undergoes are not extrinsic to the self, but part of its being. Or it is a dialectic between ipse and idem that grants changes and variations an ontological status within personal identity. Ricoeur acknowledges that his whole hermeneutic phenomenology of the acting human being is based on Aristotle's schema of act and potentiality, which he considers in the course to be Aristotle's true discovery. For many commentators who may have found Ricoeur's use of Plato and Aristotle in his later works to be a little bit ad hoc, this course of 1953-54 provides the missing link as well as the full justification.

A final word on the translation. David Pellauer has been one of the main translators of Ricoeur in English and has several times collaborated with others, as in this case with John Starkey. Pellauer's profound knowledge of Ricoeur's works, his adept choice of words, and his focus on readability have allowed Ricoeur's works to become easily accessible in a clear and precise prose. This is again the case here. Despite some typos and a sentence here and there that could have been made more clear, Pellauer and Starkey have struck the right balance in their translation between the obligation of reliability toward the French original and the duty of intelligibility and readability toward the audience.