Mark Schroeder’s Being For assesses the prospects for expressivism. As Schroeder understands it, expressivism is characterized by two claims: “(1) the meaning of a sentence is the mental state that it expresses, and (2) some sentences express beliefs, but other sentences express noncognitive attitudes which are not beliefs” (p. 177). In addition to describing the relevant noncognitive attitudes in some detail and explaining why moral sentences express them rather than beliefs, expressivists about morality have an obligation to provide a semantic theory that allows a moral sentence to express the noncognitive attitude in question. Schroeder is primarily concerned with providing such a semantic theory. What he offers in this regard is quite impressive and makes Being For required reading for anyone with an interest in metaethics. Schroeder presents in remarkable detail a semantics for expressivism that overcomes a host of standard objections. However, Schroeder is not an expressivist. He argues that his account appears to be the only plausible one. Since it faces serious problems, Schroeder concludes that the prospects for expressivism are bleak.
Overview of the book
Schroeder believes formulating a semantic theory for an expressivist account of morality requires:
1. providing an account of what it is to express a mental state;
2. providing an account — compatible with our intuitions concerning consistency — of what mental states are expressed not just by atomic moral sentences but by any sentence containing only moral predicates;
3. extending the account in (2) to include non-moral predicates.
Schroeder offers a way for expressivists to accomplish the first task in Part I of the book. He addresses the second task in Part II and the third task in Part III. Schroeder is able to provide an expressivist semantics for a language having the resources of the predicate calculus and containing both moral and non-moral predicates. In Part IV, Schroeder applies his version of expressivism to areas of discourse other than moral discourse. He considers (briefly) an expressivist account of indicative conditionals and (in more detail) of truth discourse. Finally, due to the difficulty of extending his semantics to certain natural language constructions, Schroeder concludes that one ought “to wonder whether the benefits of expressivism are worth the costs” (p. 178). Since there is far too much of interest in the book to discuss it all, I will restrict my attention to sketching Schroeder’s way of accomplishing the second and third tasks and conclude by assessing whether his pessimistic view of expressivism’s prospects is justified.
Schroeder on the second task
As does Schroeder, let us assume that according to expressivism
(W) Stealing is wrong.
expresses disapproval of stealing. As Schroeder notes, a challenge for expressivists seeking to accomplish the second task is specifying the mental state expressed by
(~W) Stealing is not wrong.
and explaining why it is inconsistent with the one expressed by (W). Schroeder observes that some attitudes are what he calls inconsistency-transmitting, where attitude A is inconsistency-transmitting if and only if "two instances of A are inconsistent just in case their contents are inconsistent" (p. 43). He calls the inconsistency that results from having an inconsistency-transmitting attitude toward inconsistent contents A-type inconsistency (p. 48). Schroeder believes expressivists may assume there are inconsistency-transmitting attitudes other than the obvious example of belief; intention provides a plausible, if not uncontroversial, example (pp. 42-44). Thus, expressivists can explain the inconsistency of the attitudes expressed by (W) and (~W) as an instance of A-type inconsistency if they assume disapproval is an inconsistency-transmitting attitude and stipulate that (~W) expresses disapproval of not stealing (p. 44).
However, drawing on work by Nicholas Unwin (1999; 2001), Schroeder argues that this route is a dead end (pp. 44-49). The problem is distinguishing the mental states expressed by (W) and (~W) from that expressed by
(W~) Not stealing is wrong.
If (W) expresses disapproval of stealing, then consistency demands that (W~) expresses disapproval of not stealing, which apparently leaves nothing for (~W) to express. Indeed, Schroeder argues expressivists cannot plausibly treat (~W) as expressing disapproval of anything (p. 46).
One popular alternative view is that (~W) expresses a different kind of attitude toward stealing than (W). For example, if (W) and (W~) express disapproval while (~W) expresses toleration, then the three sentences express distinct states. However, Schroeder notes that the inconsistency between disapproval of stealing and toleration of it is not A-type inconsistency. Schroeder refers to the purported inconsistency between disapproval of stealing and toleration of stealing — inconsistency between two different attitudes toward the same content — as B-type inconsistency (p. 48). Schroeder is unhappy with appeals to B-type inconsistency, and he objects to recent versions of expressivism because they make such appeals (pp. 49-55).
Schroeder sees two major problems with appealing to B-type inconsistency. The first problem is that it is unclear both what B-type inconsistency is and if it even exists (p. 48). Now Schroeder thinks there is no satisfactory explanation of A-type inconsistency (p. 48 note 5). Nevertheless he believes there are obvious examples of it — in the case of belief, for example — so everyone must accept there is such a thing even without a precise account of it. This is not true of B-type inconsistency. The second problem is the difficulty of extending a B-type inconsistency approach to constructions other than the negations of atomic sentences (pp. 48-54). Schroeder notes that doing so requires treating every complex moral sentence as expressing a mental state that is B-type inconsistent with the mental states expressed by those sentences with which it is intuitively inconsistent. Schroeder objects that instead of providing a constructive account of these mental states that explains why this is so — which appears to be difficult if not impossible — expressivists simply assume such mental states exist. Thus, expressivists face a dilemma. Appealing to A-type inconsistency erases the difference between (~W) and (W~) while appealing to B-type inconsistency is objectionably mysterious and leaves too much unexplained.
Schroeder believes there is a way out of this dilemma. To illustrate it he imagines treating the descriptive predicate ‘green’ in the standard way expressivists treat a moral predicate, i.e., as not contributing anything to the contents of the attitudes expressed by atomic sentences in which it appears but only as specifying the type of attitude (p. 56). On this view, an atomic sentence containing ‘green’ expresses the attitude of believing-green toward its subject. So
(G) Grass is green.
expresses the attitude of believing-green towards grass — or BG. The problem arises of specifying the attitude expressed by
(~G) Grass is not green.
Presumably, it is not BG. Schroeder imagines that (~G) expresses "a distinct and also unanalyzable attitude, which we might call the believes-not-green attitude" (p. 57). Say that (~G) expresses BNG. The inconsistency between BG and BNG is the mysterious B-type inconsistency.
Of course, as Schroeder notes, we avoid appeals to B-type inconsistency in the case of ‘green’ because we believe that it helps to determine the contents of the attitudes expressed by sentences in which it occurs (p. 57). So (G) expresses the belief with the content that grass is green — or BF — while (~G) expresses the belief that grass is not green — or BF. The inconsistency between BF and BF is A-type inconsistency. Schroeder believes that expressivists must mimic this approach by abandoning the assumption that moral predicates do not contribute anything to the contents of the attitudes expressed by moral sentences (p. 57). According to Schroeder’s account, an atomic moral sentence such as ‘a is M’ expresses the mental state of being for bearing some relation R to a or FOR, where being for is a noncognitive attitude and each moral predicate M specifies a different relation (p. 58). In Chapters 5 and 6, Schroeder details a semantics according to which the mental state expressed by a complex moral sentence is a state of being for whose content is a function of the contents of the mental states expressed by that sentence’s components. For example, if sentence SX express FOR and SY expresses FOR, then the negation of SX expresses FOR while the disjunction of SX and SY expresses FOR (p. 66).
This semantics assigns a distinct mental state to each of (W), (~W), and (W~). For, assuming along with Schroeder that the relation blaming for is associated with ‘wrong’, we have (p. 59):
Mental State Expressed
(W) Stealing is wrong.
(~W) Stealing is not wrong.
(W~) Not stealing is wrong.
In general, Schroeder’s semantics allows him to specify the mental state expressed by any complex moral sentence. For example, a disjunction such as:
(S∨W) Stealing is wrong or murder is wrong.
expresses FOR.1 Furthermore, making the assumption that being for is an inconsistency-transmitting attitude allows Schroeder to explain — in terms of A-type inconsistency — for any moral sentence S why the mental state his semantics says is expressed by S is inconsistent with the mental states it says are expressed by those sentences intuitively inconsistent with S (pp. 67-71). For example, if being for is inconsistency-transmitting, then the mental states expressed by (W) and (~W) are A-type inconsistent as are the mental state expressed by (S∨W) and those expressed by the negations of its disjuncts. In both cases, the contents of the relevant states of being for are inconsistent. By the end of Part II, Schroeder has shown that by using this approach one can, while respecting our intuitions concerning consistency, provide an expressivist semantics for a language which contains only moral predicates and which has the resources of the predicate calculus.
B-Type inconsistency reconsidered
Before discussing Schroeder’s approach to the third task, I want to question whether appeals to B-type inconsistency are a dead end as Schroeder believes they are. I do not believe that B-type inconsistency is more mysterious than A-type inconsistency because it is likely that an explanation of A-type inconsistency will also explain B-type inconsistency. Explaining the A-type inconsistency of beliefs requires explaining what is defective about possessing beliefs with inconsistent contents. Whatever that defect is, it is likely that two different types of attitudes, such as believing-green and believing-not-green, could exhibit that defect when held toward the same content. The thought is that some of the work done in the explanation of A-type inconsistency by appealing to the content of the attitudes in question can be done in the explanation of B-type inconsistency by appealing to the nature of the attitudes.
To illustrate this point consider the following explanation of A-type inconsistency. (I am not endorsing it, but simply using it as an example of how to derive an explanation of B-type inconsistency from an explanation of A-type inconsistency.) David Velleman once proposed understanding belief as “the attitude of accepting a proposition with the aim of thereby accepting a truth” (2000 p. 252).2 We can explain the A-type inconsistency between BF and BF if in addition to Velleman’s proposal we assume:
(I) A set of attitudes is inconsistent just in case the aims associated with those attitudes are not mutually realizable.
To have the attitude BF is to accept g with the aim of thereby accepting a truth while to have the attitude BF is to accept ¬g with this same aim. Since these aims are not mutually realizable, BF and BF are inconsistent according to (I). Of course, more needs to be said to explain and defend this account, but this is at least a sketch of one possible explanation.
Given a certain account of the attitudes of believing-green and believing-not-green, this explanation may be extended to the B-type inconsistency between BG and BNG. Say that to have the attitude BG is to regard grass with the aim of thereby regarding something green while to have the attitude BNG is to regard grass with the aim of thereby regarding something non-green. Since these aims are not mutually realizable, BG and BNG are inconsistent according to (I). The explanation of the A-type inconsistency between BF and BF naturally extends to the B-type inconsistency between BG and BNG. We have simply transferred the negation from the content of the attitude to the description of the aim associated with the attitude, but in either case the result is the same: the aims in question are not mutually realizable because nothing can be both green and non-green. Of course, believing-green and believing-not-green are no longer treated as unanalyzable attitudes, but any explanation of either type of inconsistency between attitudes must appeal to some substantive account of the attitudes in question. My point here is that expressivists can justifiably hope that the correct explanation of A-type inconsistency also allows for B-type inconsistency. If so, it is at least possible that expressivists can explain the inconsistency between disapproval and toleration as an instance of B-type inconsistency.
Schroeder might argue that, in the absence of such further explanation, expressivists are on stronger ground assuming disapproval or being for is an inconsistency-transmitting attitude than they are assuming that disapproval and toleration are B-type inconsistent. But is this true? Expressivists can reasonably assume that there is a problem with, say, disapproving of stealing while also disapproving of not stealing. Likewise, expressivists can reasonably assume that there is a problem with disapproving of stealing while also tolerating it. However, determining whether either problem is similar enough to the problem with having inconsistent beliefs to warrant being classified as an instance of inconsistency requires appealing to an account of inconsistency as well as to accounts of the relevant attitudes. Schroeder is justified in criticizing expressivists who assume disapproval and toleration are B-type inconsistent for failing to provide these accounts. But those who assume that disapproval or being for is an inconsistency-transmitting attitude have just as much of an obligation to vindicate that assumption by providing the appropriate accounts of inconsistency and of the attitude in question.
What of the greater difficulty in explaining the logical properties of attitudes expressed by complex sentences expressivists who appeal to B-type inconsistency have compared to expressivists who only appeal to A-type inconsistency? This difficulty may not be that great. First, it is not clear — at least to me — that simply defining mental states in terms of their logical properties is as problematic as Schroeder believes. Even assuming that doing so is worrisome, there is reason to think that expressivists who appeal to B-type inconsistency can — just as Schroeder does — give a constructive account of the mental states expressed by complex sentences that does explain their logical properties. The thought is that instead of the mental state expressed by a complex sentence being a state whose content is a function of the content of the mental states expressed by the component sentences — as on Schroeder’s account — it is a state whose nature is a function of the nature of the mental states expressed by the component sentences.
Once again, an example will illustrate this point. Taking the above treatment of BG and BNG as a model, expressivists who accept account (I) of inconsistency could offer the following treatment of negations and disjunctions: if sentence SX expresses the state of regarding x with aim AX and SY expresses the state of regarding y with aim AY, then the negation of SX expresses the state of regarding x with the aim of not realizing aim AX while the disjunction of SX and SY expresses the state of regarding x and regarding y with the aim of realizing at least one of AX or AY. If expressivists take disapproving of x to be regarding it with aim Ax, then (W) expresses the state of regarding stealing with aim As. (W~) expresses the state of regarding not stealing with aim Anots while (~W) expresses the state of regarding stealing with the aim of not realizing As, which is what toleration of stealing is on this view. Furthermore, (S∨W) expresses the mental state of regarding stealing and regarding murder with the aim of realizing at least one of As or Am. According to (I) the mental states expressed by (W) and (~W) are B-type inconsistent as are the mental state expressed by (S∨W) and those expressed by the negations of its components. For, in either case, the relevant aims are not mutually realizable.
Of course, whether expressivists can plausibly work out the details of such an approach remains to be seen. Doing so requires, among other things, a plausible specification of the aims at issue. One possibility, which draws on Schroeder’s account, is that (W) expresses the state of regarding stealing with the aim of thereby bringing about blaming for stealing. My aim in regarding stealing is to produce by doing so a particular outcome — i.e., blaming for stealing. Similarly, in the case of BF, my aim in accepting g is to produce by doing so a particular outcome — i.e., accepting a truth. In the end neither this approach nor any other in terms of B-type inconsistency may work, but appealing to B-type inconsistency appears to me to be a more viable option for expressivists than Schroeder believes it to be.
Schroeder on the third task
Instead of pursuing a B-type inconsistency approach to the second task, let us return to Schroeder’s way of proceeding. Schroeder argues that expressivists who adopt his approach must treat all sentences as expressing the noncognitive attitude of being for (pp. 89-92). One of Schroeder’s reasons for believing this can be seen by considering the sentences in what I will call the Mixed Set:
(~W) Stealing is not wrong.
(~B) The sky is not blue.
(W∨B) Stealing is wrong or the sky is blue.
As Schroeder recognizes, explaining the inconsistency of the three sentences in the Mixed Set in terms of A-type inconsistency requires that the purely descriptive sentence (~B) and the hybrid sentence (W∨B) also express the noncognitive attitude of being for (p. 91). For only if this is so can we see the three sentences as expressing three instances of a single inconsistency-transmitting attitude toward inconsistent contents. Schroeder realizes that some might think that a commitment to treating descriptive sentences as expressing the same noncognitive attitude as moral sentences by itself dooms expressivism (p. 92). Nevertheless, in Part III, he presses on to see how far expressivists can go.
Unfortunately, expressivists immediately encounter trouble. According to Schroeder, expressivists are committed to what he calls mentalism, “the view that descriptive language gets its content from the contents of corresponding mental states — beliefs” (p. 24). The most straightforward and natural story of how a descriptive sentence gets its content according to mentalism is that its content is given by the propositional content of the belief it expresses. However, Schroeder argues that his expressivist semantics from Part II is not compatible with such a story (pp. 95-97).
This incompatibility arises because, as we have just seen, expressivists are committed to holding that descriptive sentences express the noncognitive attitude of being for. Thus, if descriptive sentences express beliefs, then beliefs are states of being for. Schroeder first proposes understanding believing that p as being for proceeding as if p or FOR, where to proceed as if p is to take p as settled in practical deliberation (pp. 93-95). On this analysis, to believe a proposition is to bear the relation of being for proceeding as if to it. Schroeder’s expressivist semantics is compatible with atomic descriptive sentences expressing beliefs so understood. The semantics allows, for example, expressivists to stipulate that
(B) The sky is blue.
expresses the mental state of being for proceeding as if the sky is blue or FOR, which is the belief that the sky is blue according to Schroeder’s analysis. Unfortunately, Schroeder argues a problem occurs with complex sentences (pp. 95-97). If (B) expresses FOR then its negation or
(~B) The sky is not blue.
does not express FOR, which is the belief that the sky is not blue according to Schroeder’s analysis. For, according to Schroeder’s expressivist semantics, the mental state expressed by (~B) is a function of the one expressed by (B). In particular, if (B) expresses FOR, then (~B) expresses FOR. Nevertheless, according to Schroeder’s analysis of belief, FOR is not a belief; to be in the mental state FOR is to bear the relation of not being for proceeding as if to a proposition and not the relation of being for proceeding as if. In addition, the propositional content of this non-belief FOR is b, which does not correctly specify the content of the sentence (~B).
As Schroeder notes, one cannot avoid these problems by claiming that ¬pai b is equivalent to pai ¬b since not proceeding as if b clearly differs from proceeding as if ¬b (p. 96). Nor does Schroeder believe that replacing the proceeding as if relation with some other relation R will help matters since it is unlikely that there is any plausible candidate for R for which ¬R p is equivalent to R ¬p (p. 97). Thus, if an atomic descriptive sentence expresses a belief whose propositional content gives its content, then its negation does not. Schroeder concludes that his semantics does not allow expressivists to say that the content of an arbitrary descriptive sentence is given by the propositional content of the belief — or other mental state — it expresses.
Fortunately for expressivists, Schroeder offers them some alternative methods for assigning the correct content to descriptive sentences. In Chapter 8, he develops a variation of the semantic theory from Part II, a variation which he calls biforcated attitude semantics. According to it, the mental states sentences express consist of pairs of states of being for in which one member of the pair — the major — commits to the other — the minor.3 Unfortunately, even given biforcated attitude semantics and an analysis of belief as a biforcated attitude, it remains true that complex sentences do not express beliefs whose propositional content correctly specifies their content (p. 122). However, in Chapters 9 and 10, Schroeder describes two methods of assigning the correct content to a descriptive sentence neither of which requires that the sentence expresses a belief whose propositional content gives that sentence’s content. Both methods do require adopting biforcated attitude semantics, analyzing belief as a biforcated attitude, and defending a variety of assumptions about the relation of proceeding as if. The details are too complex to review here, but by the end of Part III Schroeder has provided an expressivist semantics for a language with moral and non-moral predicates as well as the resources of the predicate calculus, and he has shown both that this semantics is compatible with our intuitions concerning consistency and that it allows for the correct assignment of content to descriptive sentences, provided one is willing to accept numerous assumptions of various degrees of plausibility.
Schroeder’s assessment of expressivism
This is an impressive achievement which gives expressivists grounds for optimism. Unfortunately for expressivists, their luck runs out in Chapter 12. Here Schroeder argues that biforcated attitude semantics cannot be plausibly extended to other aspects of natural language, such as tense and modals. One problem with tense and modals is that the assumptions required to assign the correct content to descriptive sentences in which these constructions occur are clearly unacceptable (pp. 169-172). However, in Schroeder’s view, the greatest difficulty for expressivists is extending biforcated attitude semantics to the quantifier ‘most’ (p. 186). Recall that to express a biforcated attitude a sentence must express a pair of attitudes one of which commits to the other. Schroeder argues that in the case of ‘most’ none of the pairs of attitudes which are potential candidates for the mental state expressed by a sentence in which ‘most’ has widest scope is such that one member of the pair commits to the other. Thus, none of the potential candidates is actually a biforcated attitude (pp. 172-176).
Schroeder argues that these problems do not just show that the version of expressivism he develops is untenable but that expressivism in general is in trouble (pp. 177-179). For when expressivists develop their theory they will have little choice but to do so roughly in the way he does (pp. 164-169). Any adequate account of inconsistency must proceed solely in terms of A-type inconsistency, but major problems arise if one extends an A-type inconsistency account to a language including both moral predicates and descriptive predicates. Doing so requires seeing all sentences as expressing a single type of noncognitive attitude, which in turn makes necessary a noncognitive analysis of belief and the move to the complexity of biforcated attitude semantics in order to assign the correct content to descriptive sentences. Extending biforcated attitude semantics to natural language constructions such as tense, modals, or ‘most’, however, is either wildly implausible or even impossible.
If it is true that Schroeder’s version of expressivism is the only plausible one, then these problems justify his bleak assessment that “expressivism should not inspire our confidence” (p. 176). Expressivists must hope that it is possible to part company with Schroeder when developing the details of the theory. As I discussed above, appealing to B-type inconsistency is one possible way for expressivists to do so. If such an approach is successful, then expressivists can hopefully avoid treating descriptive sentences as expressing the same noncognitive attitude as moral sentences and, thus, avoid the worrisome problems that come along with doing so.
An example will illustrate how expressivists might proceed. Accepting the B-type inconsistency approach sketched earlier yields the following analysis of the Mixed Set:
regarding stealing with the aim of not thereby bringing about blaming for stealing
accepting b and regarding stealing with the aim of either thereby accepting a truth or thereby bringing about blaming for stealing
This approach allows expressivists to explain the inconsistency of the Mixed Set — the relevant aims are not mutually realizable — while treating (~B) and (~W) as expressing different types of mental states. For the states expressed by (~B) and (~W) involve different sub-attitudes — accepting versus regarding — as well as different types of aims. In both cases the aim is to not produce a certain outcome via the sub-attitude in question, but in the case of (~B) the relevant outcome involves possessing the sub-attitude at issue — i.e., accepting b — only in certain conditions while in the case of (~W) it involves blaming for stealing and not the sub-attitude of regarding stealing. Furthermore, it is plausible to see the aim associated with (~B) as establishing in some sense a standard of correctness for the sub-attitude in question: it is correct to possess that sub-attitude iff ¬b.5 Thus, expressivists can identify the content of (~B) with this correctness condition.
Of course, adopting any such approach in terms of B-type inconsistency requires — in addition to specifying the notion of correctness — demonstrating that the approach can handle other natural language constructions and that it does not encounter problems as worrisome as those which plague Schroeder’s account. Nevertheless an approach in terms of B-type inconsistency is at least a promising alternative.
Schroeder argues that whether they attempt to solve the problems with his approach or develop an alternative to it, proponents of expressivism “have far more work to do before it can earn its place as the sort of hypothesis on which rational investigators can place any significant credence” (p. 179). Expressivists certainly have more work to do, but I hope my comments demonstrate that their situation might not be as bad as Schroeder believes. There is more reason than Schroeder allows for thinking it is possible to develop a plausible alternative to his version of expressivism that avoids its problems. Of course, I have only sketched a possible way of doing so. The devil is, as always, in the details. As Schroeder correctly concludes, any alternative will need to be worked out much more fully — especially in respect to its semantics
- to properly evaluate it (p. 187). Being For sets an impressive standard for the level of detail required.6
Dreier, James. 2006. Negation for Expressivists: A Collection of Problems with a Suggestion for their Solution. Oxford Studies in Metaethics 1: 217-233.
Shah, Nishi and David Velleman. 2005. Doxastic Deliberation. The Philosophical Review 114: 497-534.
Unwin, Nicholas. 1999. Quasi-Realism, Negation, and the Frege-Geach Problem. The Philosophical Quarterly 49: 337-352.
—. 2001. Norms and Negation: A Problem for Gibbard’s Logic. The Philosophical Quarterly 51: 60-75.
Velleman, David. 2000. On the Aim of Belief. In The Possibility of Practical Reason. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
1 I want to note one worry about Schroeder’s treatment of disjunction. Consider the attitude that those who accept (S∨W) without accepting either disjunct have toward the two options of blaming for stealing and blaming for murder. This attitude appears to be best characterized as a commitment to being for at least one while being undecided which one to be for. On the other hand, the attitude of those who possess the mental state FOR (blaming for stealing or blaming for murder) appears to be best characterized as one of indifference between blaming for stealing and blaming for murder as long as at least one activity is blamed. So it is unclear that Schroeder’s semantics assigns the correct mental state to (S∨W). For more on this difference between indecision and indifference, especially in relation to expressivism, see Dreier 2006.