Being Inclined: Félix Ravaisson's Philosophy of Habit

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Mark Sinclair, Being Inclined: Félix Ravaisson's Philosophy of Habit, Oxford University Press, 2019, 229pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198844587.

Reviewed by Mathilde Tahar, Université Toulouse Jean-Jaurès


Mark Sinclair's book is one of the first commentaries in English on the philosophy of Ravaisson, an author little read today, who nevertheless influenced a whole generation of (especially French) philosophers. Sinclair sheds light on how the Ravaissonian concept of habit takes on a metaphysical rather than psychological meaning that has a great influence on French philosophy at the beginning of the twentieth century. He also shows to what extent habit plays the role of method in the philosophy of Ravaisson. Sinclair not only offers us an internal commentary on Ravaisson but also tries to see how his philosophical approach sheds light on contemporary issues.

Sinclair wishes to highlight the metaphysical dimension of habit in Ravaisson's philosophy. Habit is characterized by inclination, which, according to Ravaisson, is at the root of both will and action: all dispositions, capacities, powers are to some degree a function of inclination or tendency. And since nothing exists in the world without dispositions or capacities, nothing exists without inclination. Sinclair's aim is to show how Ravaisson proposes an original idea of inclination without necessitation, an idea of non-mechanical inclination. This way of conceiving a non-mechanical causality, a tendency which would be the very being of beings, leads to the reformulation of great philosophical problems: the problem of the link between the mind and the world, the problem of action, the problem of causality (theory of causation and metaphysics of powers). Speaking, as Ravisson does, of inclination and tendency in habit as a disposition, a virtue, can serve to enlighten and develop some contemporary problematics, as well as illuminate his philosophy.

The first and second chapters situate Ravaisson's thought in the philosophical debates of the late nineteenth and early twentieth century, inasmuch as this thought is reducible neither to its sources nor to its influence on later philosophers.

Sinclair begins by studying the influence of Bichat and Maine de Biran on Ravaisson's thought, while highlighting his originality. If Bichat seeks to give a phenomenology of habit where Maine de Biran proposes rather a genealogy, both emphasize the "double law of habit": the double link of habit and will according to whether we speak of active habit (development of a skill) which initially requires a strong intervention of the will, or of passive habit (getting used to a noise, for instance) which seems to take place without the intervention of the will. Ravaisson solves this duality by defining will not as merely free and reflective, but in a weaker sense as will applies to all degrees of thinking and even to organic processes. The acquisition of habit can only be explained by what he calls an obscure activity, which is neither purely active nor purely passive, neither purely mental nor purely physical. It is this obscure activity that he interprets as a tendency or inclination. In habit, in place of will as the cause of action, there is a mindless desire to do the action, a tendency or inclination that often brings about the action. Ravaisson introduces a gradualism into the thinking of habit: actions become less and less conscious, more and more involuntary. The difference between will, tendency and inclination is merely one of degree. It means that habituation and motor habit are not the result of two different faculties, one passive, the other active. In both cases, the force at work is not a quality of the mind abstracted from the body, or of the body abstracted from the mind. It is a spontaneity continuous with will and which also resides in some way in the organs of the body. Therefore, in both forms of habit, the same obscure activity is at work. The decline in sensation and the increased precision of action have the same cause: the increasing development of spontaneity over passivity in the body.

Sinclair then turns his attention to the reception of Ravaisson in the French philosophy of the late nineteenth and early twentieth century, to reveal in particular the shifts in meaning from Lemoine to Bergson leading to a caricatured vision of Ravaissonian philosophy. In particular, he criticizes the Bergsonian interpretation of the Ravaissonian habit as "the fossilized residue of a spiritual activity". Bergson's reading is indeed inspired by Lemoine's idea that, if habitual action comes from a habit of the will, then it cannot have any moral value, because freedom has left it. According to Ravaisson, habit is not opposed to freedom, because there is a form of freedom (yet, not reflective) in inclination. Bergson takes up Lemoine's interpretation: the process by which a motor habit is contracted is certainly free and voluntary, but the habit once acquired is a mechanism devoid of spirituality and therefore of freedom. Because Bergson differentiates between spiritual freedom and material mechanism, the problem of the origin of habit is an insoluble one. Here Bergson is dualistic, whereas Ravaisson simply proposes a gradualism. For Ravaisson, there is nothing mysterious about this, for experience offers us epistemological access to a natural spontaneity that is the very principle of habit. In this chapter, Sinclair also studies the influence of this thought on phenomenology, and particularly on the concept of "corps propre" in Merleau-Ponty, i.e., the idea that the body has a spontaneity of its own, which is neither a pure mechanism nor identical to reflective will, but is a principle of embodied agency.

The next four chapters move away from the historical dimension to deepen Ravaisson's philosophy by questioning the stakes of the concept of inclination on the philosophy of being, time, action, and causality.

Chapter 3, while focusing on the affinity between Ravaisson's and Schelling's thoughts, serves above all to highlight the status of habit in Ravaisson's philosophy. Habit is an organon for philosophy; it enables it to show what logic alone cannot grasp, just as art is the privileged implement of Schelling's philosophy. Here, "habit" means the experience of habit mediated by philosophical reflection. In Ravaisson, habit is a method that sheds light on the connection between nature and will, revealing the continuum that underlies the opposition of these two principles. It allows us to grasp the fundamental unity of nature and will, of world and mind. If habit can only exist in the organic world, there is an analog of habit in the inorganic realm, a kind of spontaneity, a tendency to persevere in the actuality that constitutes being. This tendency, according to Ravaisson, corresponds, in the inorganic realm, to inertia. The analogy of habit and inertia allows us to grasp the law of being that governs inorganic and organic realms: the tendency to persevere. Then comparing the status of habit in Ravaisson with that of art in Schelling, Sinclair proposes an analogy between the acquisition of habit and divine creation, as habit not only realizes spirit in matter, but also enables spirit to pursue higher goals. From this point of view, habit allows spirit to descend but also to climb the scale of existence, since it represents the return of freedom to nature, or the invasion of the realm of freedom by natural spontaneity.

Sinclair next offers a reflection on the modal status of inclination, which he will return to in the last chapter. For Ravaisson, the spontaneity at work in inclination is different from mechanical determinism as well as from reflective freedom. If habit is to occur, this necessity is neither logical nor physical; it implies attraction, desire. Sinclair emphasizes the influence of Leibniz's idea of moral necessity (the motive of the good inclines but does not necessitate) on the philosophy of Ravaisson, but also underlines the difference. Unlike in Leibniz, where there is a clear distinction between efficient causation and final (moral) causation, there is, for Ravaisson, absorption of one causality into the other, an embodiment of intention (final causality) in an acquired habit (which is therefore not pure mechanical causality). The more a purpose is embodied in a habit, the more the desire to achieve it becomes a matter of necessity. The acquisition of a habit leads to the loss of reflective freedom, but not of any freedom, since the acquired habit has its own form of spontaneity. There is, in Ravaisson's philosophy, a will to overcome the modern antithesis of nature and freedom: moral necessity occurs according to a continuous scale. For Ravaisson, this implies rethinking causality. Sinclair quotes Ravaisson's 1867 report: "everything is ruled, constant, and yet radically voluntary" (to be is to be inclined).

For Leibniz, everything depends on the divine will and is therefore morally necessary, whereas for Ravaisson, moral necessity describes the operation of nature itself once created. If, for him, moral necessity is also a divine providence, this is in a pantheistic sense, of the continuous presence of the divine even in inorganic beings. Sinclair also points out that Ravaisson's contribution to the conceptualization of moral necessity seems to undermine the very idea of necessity. If habitual actions become necessary, the necessity of attraction and desire is not a real one: a gradual necessity is no necessity at all. In this chapter, Sinclair also studies another aspect of Ravaisson's reception of Leibniz: the idea that every being presupposes an activity, a tendency. In Ravaisson, too, substance is tendency, it is the activity of desire. However, unlike Leibniz, this tendency does not imply any effort at all; rather, it is an easier and gracious desire.

In the next chapter, Sinclair deals with the influence Ravaisson may have had on the philosophies of time. His thesis is that the two great themes of French philosophy at the end of the nineteenth century, time and habit, have the same root: the concept of duration as an original synthesis of past, present and future. While Ravaisson defines quantification as intimately linked to spatialization and emphasizes the difference between time and space, he does not develop a conceptualization of time as irreducible to quantity. Rather, it is in his analysis of habit that we will finally find a thematization of duration. Indeed, Ravaisson emphasizes habit is a continuum, inasmuch as it presupposes a recording of the past, but also an impulse towards the future. Habit is not a passive state, but a disposition: it is a conservation of the past in the present, but it is also a propelling force. In Ravaisson, the concept of "habit" refers not only to an acquired habit or habits but also to the power to acquire them: a power of conservation and reproduction. Hence, habit, as a contraction of the past, present and future, requires the reconsideration of linear and quantifiable time, that is to say, it entails the concept of duration that will be so successful in French philosophy in the twentieth century.

Finally, Sinclair returns to the question of the modality of inclination, focusing on the metaphysics of powers developed by Stephen Mumford and Rani Lill Anjum with its attempt to define the modality of powers as a dispositional modality. Sinclair uses Ravaisson's thought to criticize but also to develop their claims, and in return the metaphysics of powers sheds light on Ravaisson's position, particularly in relation to the Leibnizian conception of necessity. Sinclair develops a thoroughly original analysis of the modality of tendency or inclination by synthesizing what he retains from the contemporary metaphysics of powers and from the teachings of Ravaisson's philosophy. Sinclair wonders whether it is possible to define a dispositional modality with the help of the idea of tendency developed by Ravaisson in Of Habit.

Sinclair has already shown that the modality of inclination could not be necessity, since desire in the acquisition of habit was continuous with reflective freedom. Nor can it be equated with the category of possibility, since the realization of a tendency is not only one of several equivalent possibilities. This leads him to ask whether tendency or inclination is a sui generis modal category that would stand between necessity and possibility, and that would be reducible neither to conditional necessity (A is connected to B under certain conditions), nor to a statistical conception of disposition that would reduce the modality to probability (most often A is linked to B). To understand what this sui generis modality would be, Sinclair refers to Mumford and Anjum's What Tends to Be: The Philosophy of Dispositional Modality, which is both a response to criticism and a further elaboration of their book Getting Causes from Powers. Dispositional modality is described as follows: a force internal to something can produce an effect without necessitating the latter, and this force may not come to its manifestation although nothing prevents it. The force or power in its manifestation is intrinsically and primitively a function of tendency rather than necessity.

There is, according to Sinclair, a crucial modal innovation here, in that this notion of tendency is irreducible to conditional necessity. It is at this point that Sinclair shows the richness of Ravaisson's confrontation with contemporary philosophy. On the one hand, this development by Anjum and Mumford sheds light on Ravaisson's position. While the latter may have spoken of a form of moral necessity, he never endorsed the idea of a conditional necessity that we may find in Leibniz. For Ravaisson, the force of habit, i.e., tendency, does not have to come to its manifestation, even when nothing prevents it from manifesting itself. Existence is a form of natural spontaneity and relatively effortless grace. This grace is irreducible to any form of necessity, even though Ravaisson keeps the word "necessity". The metaphysics of powers thus makes it possible to elucidate some of the apparent paradoxes of Ravaisson's philosophy. But on the other hand, the philosophy of Ravaisson also sheds light on the developments of Mumford and Anjum. According to Sinclair, Mumford and Anjum do not really have arguments for their dispositional modality, whereas the experience of habit in Ravaisson makes it possible to give meaning to this sui generis modality, by showing that tendency and inclination are both continuous with and irreducible to reflective will.

Sinclair's monograph on Ravaisson is original in that it combines conceptual precision, historical contextualization and perspective through confrontation with contemporary philosophy. He shows Ravaisson's immense influence on twentieth century philosophy, but also his originality and topicality. While Sinclair highlights Ravaisson's conceptual innovations, he also does not hesitate to reveal his paradoxes and limitations, particularly on the problem of necessity at work in tendency. He also brings Ravaisson's work into dialogue with contemporary research on the metaphysics of powers, has the great virtue of constantly preserving the irreducibility of Ravaisson's thought, notably by underlining the difference in the stakes. Ravaisson's philosophy is neither a metaphysics of powers nor a psychological philosophy, although it can shed light on some of their questions: it sketches a philosophy of nature and proposes a graduated panpsychic metaphysics, which has no place in the reflections of Mumford and Anjum that Sinclair discusses.

Sinclair's work thus seems to me not only relevant, but also necessary: it restores Ravaisson's philosophy to its rightful place, while at the same time incisively questioning contemporary theories. A fair critical review must sometimes consent not to criticize.