Being Rational and Being Right

Comesan A Rational Right

Juan Comesaña, Being Rational and Being Right, Oxford University Press, 2020, 222pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198847717.

Reviewed by Adam Marushak, South China Normal University


Suppose you’re hungry and your friend offers you what looks to be a piece of candy. Upon taking a bite, however, you realize that what you thought was candy is actually a marble that looks like candy. Intuitively, your action of putting the marble in your mouth was rational even though you did not succeed in satisfying your hunger. In Being Rational and Being Right, Juan Comesaña argues that cases like these—where rational action is based on a false belief—pose problems for prominent theories of evidence and rational decision.

Consider, for example, the theories of evidence Comesaña calls ‘Factualism’ and ‘Psychologism’. Factualism holds that evidence is knowledge, and Psychologism holds that evidence consists in either our experiences themselves or propositions about our experiences. Now, in the marble example above, the object your friend offers you is a marble, so given the factivity of knowledge, what you know must be consistent with the object’s being a marble. Your experience of seeing what looks to be a piece of candy must also be consistent with the object’s being a marble, since you are having this experience even though the object is actually a marble. Consequently, according to both Factualism and Psychologism, your evidence is compatible with the possibility that the object you are given is a marble. Why, then, is it perfectly rational for you to ignore this possibility when putting the object in your mouth?

Comesaña’s answer lies in a theory of evidence he calls ‘Experientialism’: our evidence consists in those propositions that we are non-inferentially justified or rational in believing—namely, those propositions that we are justified in believing in virtue of their figuring as the content of our experience (Comesaña uses ‘justified’ and ‘rational’ interchangeably; note also that the justification in question must be ultima facie, or undefeated). Since your experience of what looks to be a candy non-inferentially justifies you in believing that the object is a piece of candy, the proposition “the object is a piece of candy” is part of your evidence. Hence, it was rational for you to reach for the object given your desire for a snack, and it was rational for you to ignore the possibility that the object was a marble since your evidence rules out this possibility. Thus, contra Psychologism, evidence consists in propositions about worldly states of affairs like the object's being a piece of candy. And contra Factualism, evidence propositions do not even need to be true, let alone known.

Experientialism is a simple and attractive theory of evidence, and Comesaña expertly develops the view by situating it in the context of a wide range of topics in epistemology and decision theory—including Bayesianism, knowledge-based decision theory, the epistemology of perception, deontic logic, the problem of easy knowledge, evidentialism, and reliabilism. Objective Bayesianism provides the general theoretical framework of Comesaña’s epistemology. He argues that all forms of Bayesianism are literally false due to the problem of logical omniscience, but he takes the probability calculus to provide a useful idealization for investigating rational belief in light of ignorance of empirical fact. Comesaña advocates a version of Objective Bayesianism on which there is a unique, rational ur-prior. The constraints on this ur-prior are determined by facts about which bodies of evidence support which hypotheses. For example, the proposition “we have observed many green emeralds” supports the hypothesis “all emeralds are green”, and Comesaña holds that this fact about evidential support makes us a priori justified in having a high conditional credence in all emeralds being green given that we have observed many green emeralds. Rational belief at a time t is then determined by conditionalizing the rational ur-prior on one’s evidence at t—where Experientialism, combined with an account of defeaters, provides the theory of what evidence one possesses at t.

The strength of Comesaña’s position lies in its explanatory power with regard to an impressive range of data concerning rational belief and rational action. My discussion here will be limited to a critical assessment of what I take to be Comesaña’s main argument for Experientialism.

Recall Comesaña’s objections to Factualism and Psychologism: these theories allow for too many possible states of the world to be compatible with a subject’s evidence and thus cannot explain why it is rational for the subject to ignore these possibilities when making decisions. Now, it is noteworthy that Comesaña never provides a fully specified decision problem in order to sustain this objection. For instance, in the marble example above, it is not clear that allowing states of the world where the object is a marble yields the outcome that it is irrational to put the object in one's mouth. After all, the consequences of the object’s being a marble are not too dire, and the probability of the object’s being a marble given everything that one knows is very small, so the expected utility of putting the object in one’s mouth might still be higher than all of one’s other options, even if one’s evidence is limited to what one knows. If Comesaña instead modified the case so that the consequences of eating a marble were dire, then it is not clear that we would still judge that it is rational to put the object in one’s mouth simply because it looks like a piece of candy. Nevertheless, the general idea behind Comesaña’s argument is plausible: allowing what are essentially skeptical hypotheses into a decision problem may affect the calculation of expected utilities in ways that lead to incorrect predictions about what it is rational to do. Experientialism has the virtue of explaining why we are rational in ignoring such hypotheses even if they obtain: such hypotheses are inconsistent with some false proposition that is the content of our experience.

The point I wish to explore, however, is that Experientialism makes the correct predictions about rational action only provided some non-trivial assumptions about the content of experience. For instance, suppose that in the marble example, the content of your experience is limited to proper and common sensibles such as the object’s being small, brown, and round. If your evidence is limited to such low-level perceptual contents, then your evidence will remain compatible with the possibility that the object is a marble, since the object’s color and shape are compatible with it being a marble. A natural reply here would be that one’s evidence can also include propositions inferred from these low-level contents, and so one’s evidence can still include the inferred proposition that the object is a piece of candy. However, this is not a reply that Comesaña can give. First, in his response to the problem of easy knowledge in Chapter 8, he denies that ampliative inferences can yield justified belief, let alone evidence. Second, in Chapter 4, he argues that allowing for evidence grounded in ampliative inference would overstate the strength of one’s epistemic position. Conditionalizing on ampliatively-acquired evidence would require assigning probability 1 to the ampliatively-acquired evidence proposition, but this would amount to irrational overconfidence, since by hypothesis, the grounds of this ampliatively-acquired evidence do not entail the evidence proposition. As a result,Comesaña cannot hold that one gains evidence that the object is candy via an ampliative inference from the object’s color, shape, and one's other background knowledge.

So far, all we have shown is that Experientialism has commitments as to the content of experience: the theory makes the correct predictions about cases of rational action only if experience has high-level content, such as the proposition that an object is a piece of candy. However, there is a more serious problem lurking nearby. It is not obvious that all cases of rational action based on false belief are cases where the content of one’s false belief matches the content of one’s experience. Consider the possibility that the object your friend gives you contains razor blades. This possibility is consistent with the proposition that the object is a piece of candy, so even if Comesaña is right that the object’s being a piece of candy is part of your evidence, he has not shown that your evidence rules out the possibility that the object contains razor blades. This latter possibility would seem to make trouble for the calculation of expected utilities in exactly the same way as the possibility that the object is a marble: both possibilities are bizarre states of affairs that one does not normally take into consideration when making decisions. Thus, if Comesaña is right that the rationality of putting the object in one’s mouth requires that one’s evidence rules out the possibility that the object is a marble, then it would seem that the rationality of one’s action also depends on one’s evidence ruling out the possibility that the object contains razor blades. However, it is not clear that the content of experience extends so far as to represent how things are inside the objects one perceives. Moreover, we can run the same type of argument with possibilities that are even further removed from the content of experience. Consider the possibility that your friend has given you a normal piece of candy that you have consumed without incident in the past, but on this occasion, you will have a fatal allergic reaction to eating the candy. One typically does not take such possibilities into consideration, but it is doubtful that one has had any experience whose content rules out an allergic reaction.

The general difficulty is that Comesaña’s account of evidence seems too thin for evidence to play the demanding role required by his theory of rational action. The latter requires our evidence to be inconsistent with every bizarre possibility that we do not normally consider in decision making. And yet Experientialism limits our evidence to only those propositions that figure as the content of experience. Resolving this puzzle is no simple task. If we give up the idea that only evidence can rule out possibilities for decision making, then we risk losing the plausible constraint that rational action requires rational belief. Alternatively, if we expand our account of evidence to include propositions inferred from the contents of experience, then we run afoul of Comesaña’s plausible critique of inferential evidence. Thinking through these puzzles is a worthy task, and Comesaña’s book provides an excellent guide.