Being Realistic About Reasons

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T. M. Scanlon, Being Realistic About Reasons, Oxford University Press, 2014, 132pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199678488.

Reviewed by Bruce Russell, Wayne State University


If there are footprints in the sand at the water's edge, there is reason to believe that someone recently walked along the beach. There is reason to want to live a long, happy, and productive life. There is reason to feel sad if someone you love has died. There is reason to have a doctor set your broken arm. There is reason to save a drowning child if you are a good swimmer and to relieve a child's suffering if you can. There are reasons to believe, to desire, to feel, and to act. That is what normativity is about: reasons. And what are reasons? Tim Scanlon is famous for his insight that reasons are considerations that count in favor of something (see, p. 44; also, p. 30): a belief, a desire, a feeling, an action. In this book Scanlon argues for the view that there are irreducibly normative truths that are independent of us (see pp. 93-94 on independence), though in this book he is concerned "mainly with the idea of a reason for action," having "little to say about reasons of other kinds" (p. 2). For Scanlon, to say that they are irreducible is to say that, they "are not reducible to or identifiable with non-normative truths, such as truths about the natural world of physical objects, causes and effects, nor can they be explained in terms of notions of rationality or rational agency that are not themselves claims about reasons" (p. 2). He calls his view Reasons Fundamentalism because he thinks there are truths about reasons that are irreducible and independent of us. For Scanlon, reasons are facts (p. 30, note 20), natural (e.g., that you will enjoy some activity) or normative (e.g., a law's being unjust or your having reason to go on living; cf., p. 32). These facts are an essential part of a relation to an agent: consideration (or fact) p is a reason for x to do a in circumstances c. As Scanlon often says, "is a reason for" is a four-place relation, R(p, x, c, a) (pp. 31, 37).

Scanlon thinks that common sense supports the view that there are truths about reasons (pp. 2, 61). So why would anyone deny the view he defends? Well, philosophers have metaphysical worries about what would make such claims true and epistemological concerns about how we could know they are true if they are. Also, how could beliefs, whose objects are propositions about what there is reason to do, motivate people to act accordingly? Don't we need desires to explain motivations to act, not just beliefs? And even if Reasons Fundamentalism could answer the question about why people are motivated by their beliefs about reasons for action, there is the further question about why they must be motivated, which, according to Scanlon, is what Christine Korsgaard calls "The Normative Question" (see, pp. 9-10 for his distinction between these two different questions).

Lecture 2: the metaphysical objection and Scanlon's reply: domain-specific standards determine truth

Scanlon's defense of Reasons Fundamentalism consists mostly of replying to the metaphysical, epistemological, and motivational (which he prefers to call practical) objections to the view. He understands the metaphysical objection to be "that the idea that there are irreducible normative truths has implications that are incompatible with plausible views about 'what there is'" (p. 17). The trouble is that people like J. L. Mackie just assume that plausible views about what there is imply that nothing other than physical objects and what empirical science can study exist. Scanlon's own view is domain-specific. It holds that in the domains of mathematics, science, and moral and practical reasoning there are statements that are, "capable of truth and falsity, and that the truth values of statements about one domain, insofar as they do not conflict with statements of some other domain, are properly settled by the standards of the domain that they are about" (p. 19). In this statement, it is unclear what "properly settled" means. Does it have an epistemic meaning which implies that adhering to the standards of the domain provides us with justified beliefs about which statements in the domain are true, which false, or does it have a metaphysical meaning which implies that statements that are determined by the relevant standards are true? In his Lecture 3 on the motivational (or practical) objection, Scanlon says, "Normative truths do not require strange metaphysical truth-makers. Such truths are determined by the standards of the normative domain itself" (p. 62; my italics). On the other hand, he also says, "what is required to justify any existential claim, and what follows from such a claim, varies, depending on the kind of thing that is claimed to exist [say, mountains or numbers or reasons]" (p. 25; my italics and material in brackets).

Scanlon takes Gilbert Harman's explanatory requirement to be a domain-specific standard for science and the natural world, and the way he interprets it makes it sound like an epistemic standard. According to Scanlon, the explanatory requirement says, or implies, that "we have reason to be committed to the existence of things of a certain sort in the natural world only if they play a role in explaining what happens in the natural world (including our experience of it)" (p. 26; my italics). He goes on to say that,

We have reason to quantify over numbers if quantifying over numbers is a good way to formulate this theory. We also have reason to introduce terms denoting new kinds of numbers (such as imaginary and complex numbers) just in case these are useful in providing a more coherent and satisfying account of the relevant parts of mathematics. (p. 26; my italics)

In a footnote that follows soon after this quote, Scanlon says, "In all these domains the task that justifies the introduction of new entities or concepts is the task of describing or explaining the phenomena in question: events in the physical world, or the mathematical or normative facts" (p. 26, note 14; my italics).

These passages show that sometimes Scanlon seems to take domain-specific standards to be epistemic standards, that is, standards that determine what we are justified in believing is true, or have reason to be committed to or accept as true, not truth itself. But what we have reason to believe, be committed to, or accept may not be true. There is a logical gap between justified belief and reasonable commitment or acceptance, and truth: having a justified belief, commitment, or acceptance does not guarantee that what is believed, accepted, or the object of commitment is true.

But then the question about what makes statements about numbers and reasons true remains unanswered. Platonists will say that there are mathematical and normative facts that make such statements true (in the above quote from p. 26, note 14 Scanlon does refer to such facts), but seems to think that this would introduce "strange metaphysical truth-makers," which he wants to avoid (62). Perhaps they are strange only if you already believe that only physical objects and empirically observable properties exist, but clearly Scanlon does not believe that since he thinks there are numbers and reasons.

In any case, Scanlon seems to be of two minds about the nature of domain-specific standards,: sometimes treating them as determining truth, sometimes as determining reasonable belief, acceptance, or commitment. He might claim that a normative judgment reached through reflective equilibrium performed in the right way is thereby both true and justified. On p. 103 he does say that truths about reasons are what you would reach if you carried out the process of reflective equilibrium "in the right way." But fallibilism regarding justification seems true, and so that claim must be false: starting from justified beliefs and making justified inferences does not guarantee that you will reach the truth in any domain.

Scanlon distinguishes between what he calls pure and mixed normative claims. Pure claims of reasons to act are conditionals of the form: for all x, if x is in circumstances c, then there is reason for x to a. An example might be: for all x, if doing a is painful for x in circumstances c, then there is reason for x to avoid doing a (cf., p. 85). So if x's sliding his hand along a sharp knife causes x pain, then in relevant circumstances, there will be a reason for x not to slide his hand along that knife. The conclusion that there is reason for x not to slide his hand along the knife is what Scanlon calls a mixed normative claim. It follows from the pure normative conditional plus facts about the circumstances and that x's sliding his hand along the knife will cause him pain (cf., pp. 94-95).

There are also pure normative conditionals whose antecedent is a claim about reasons and whose consequent does not involve any such claim. They are the reverse of the above sort of conditional whose antecedent is not normative but whose consequent is. One such claim might be the hedonistic principle that says: for all x, if there is a reason for x to a in circumstances c, then a-ing in c will give x pleasure or help him avoid pain (cf., p. 101). I do not believe that this conditional is true, but a conditional like this one could be used to conclude that there is no reason for some particular person to a in c because a-ing will not give him pleasure and will not help him avoid, or relieve, pain. Scanlon thinks that these pure normative claims are necessary truths, but he believes that the necessity involved is neither logical, nor conceptual, nor metaphysical, but rather a special kind of normative necessity (p. 39 and p. 41, note 40). I will later question whether there is this special sort of necessity, but I now want to turn to what Scanlon says in Lectures 3 and 4 about the authority of practical reasons and how we can have knowledge of normative claims, respectively.

Lecture 3: the practical objection and Scanlon's reply: what rational creatures take to be reasons explains their motivation; there actually being reasons can provide the authority behind what people take to be reasons

Non-cognitivists often object to normative realism on the ground that it cannot explain how reasons can motivate. The mere fact that some normative claim is true cannot explain what motivates people, nor can a mere belief that some such claim is true. For instance, the mere fact that someone is out to kill me cannot motivate me to take precautions if I am not aware of that fact, and even if I am aware of it, I have to want something, say, to go on living, for my belief that this person wants to kill me to move me, or incline me, to act. If I wish I were dead but don't have enough courage to commit suicide, I might welcome the fact that someone is out to kill me. The objection is that what motivates me is a function of both my beliefs and desires, not just my beliefs. So how do the normative realists explain how a person's mere belief that he has sufficient, or conclusive reason, to a motivate him to a?

Scanlon's answer is in terms of the nature of a rational person. Necessarily, a rational person is generally moved by what she takes to be a reason for action, just as a chocolate lover is generally moved to eat what she takes to be food made of chocolate. Scanlon points out that non-cognitivists agree with him that a rational person is generally moved by what he takes to be sufficient, or conclusive, reasons to act. However, the non-cognitivist interprets treating something as a reason to be equivalent to accepting some imperative or, as with Allan Gibbard, accepting some plan about what to do and when. Of course, barring weakness of the will, emotional upset, and the like, any rational being who accepts a normative imperative or action plan will act accordingly. On the other hand, the normative realist will interpret treating some consideration as a, or as sufficient or conclusive, reason to act as believing that some relevant normative proposition is true, or that some consideration counts in favor of his acting in a certain way. On this account, any rational creature who holds such a belief will be disposed to act accordingly. That follows from the nature of a rational creature. So Scanlon thinks that normative realists are in no worse situation than non-cognitivists in explaining how a person can be motivated by what he takes to be a reason to act.

Further, Scanlon thinks that the normative realist is in a better position to explain the authority of practical reasons. The non-cognitivists have trouble explaining how a person could give practical advice, justify her view, and account for the possibility of being radically mistaken. If to have a normative view is simply to have a plan about what to do and when, as Gibbard thinks, then I could always say, "So what?" when you advise me to act in a certain way or try to justify your acting in some way. Why should I care that your plan tells you what to do if you were, or even if anyone were, in my circumstances? Why should I accept the prescriptions of your plan or think that your plan really justifies me in doing what it says I should do in my circumstances, or even justifies you in acting as your plan requires? And if you grant that your plan could be mistaken, for a non-cognitivist this can only mean that parts of it might be mistaken relative to some other higher-order part of the plan. But maybe that higher-order part is also mistaken, though for the expressivist that could only be relative to some even higher-order part of the plan. But, it might be objected, it's possible that your entire plan is mistaken, but that could not make sense on the non-cognitivist's view. Scanlon is not sure that the claim that all of our normative judgments might be mistaken is true, for he does not see how the judgment that "pain is in general to be avoided rather than to be sought" could be mistaken (p. 61, note 15). Still, finite beings like us must have some highest order plans, and it's possible that any one of those is mistaken. But non-cognitivists cannot make sense of this possibility either.

In sum, Scanlon answers the practical objections by arguing that normative realists like him can account for motivations to act as well as their non-cognitivist opponents and that advice, justification and the possibility of error make better sense on their view than on the views of the non-cognitivists.

Lecture 4: the epistemic objection and Scanlon's reply (in my words): reflective equilibrium as a type of non-doxastic, modest foundationalism

It is argued that if normative realism were true, we could have normative knowledge only if we had a mysterious faculty of intuition that enabled us to somehow "see" the strange metaphysical truth-makers in virtue of which these normative claims are true (cf., pp. 70, 85). The normative epistemology that Scanlon defends is a form of reflective equilibrium which consists of three parts (cf., pp. 76-77): (1) a set of considered normative judgments about what there is reason to do, of any level of generality. It could be about specific examples where it seems obvious that a person has reason, say, to take an aspirin to cure his headache or to do something to relieve a child's suffering, or a judgment of a more general nature, say, that usually the fact that you will enjoy something is a reason to do that thing (cf., p. 102) and that it will cause you serious physical pain is a reason to avoid it (cf., p. 85). (2) even more general principles, say, the principle that your own pleasure and pain are the only fundamental reasons for action; and (3) the process whereby you try to reconcile any inconsistencies between (1) and (2) and look for general principles that will explain, or account for, your considered normative judgments that remain after your attempts at reaching consistency in your normative judgments. If one of your considered normative judgments is that there is reason to relieve a child's suffering when you easily can, then you might give up the general principle that says that your own pleasure and pain are the only fundamental reasons to act. On the other hand, you might give up your considered judgment that, other things being equal, there is always reason to favor members of our own species over others in light of a more general principle that says that levels of consciousness, suffering, and satisfaction are all that really matter.

People rightly object to reflective equilibrium when it is understood as a form of epistemic coherentism (Scanlon refers to a recent article by Thomas Kelly and Sarah McGrath that is relevant here, p. 82, notes 22 and 24). Scanlon's example that can be used against coherentism involves his belief, on no evidence, that there is a rock on the moon with his name on it, where we can assume that this belief coheres with others he holds (cf., pp. 82-83). Elsewhere I have given the example of a person who has a complex and coherent set of beliefs about intelligent alien life on Gliese 581d, or Kepler 186f, recently discovered planets that scientists think might be friendly to life. Scanlon's belief about the rock and this person's beliefs about intelligent life on those planets are not justified because they are based on wishful thinking or an unconstrained, over active imagination, not on any evidence. Still, the examples can be constructed so that the relevant beliefs are coherent on any plausible account of the coherence of beliefs.

Though Scanlon does not use this terminology, he is what can be called a non-doxastic, modest foundationalist because he thinks that the justification of considered normative judgments are founded on what seems obviously true to someone when that person is "in the right conditions" (pp. 82-83, 85). He says that a judgment is a considered judgment only if the proposition that is its object seems clearly true after the person has been unable to discover any "implausible implications or presuppositions" of that proposition (p. 84). Though Scanlon does not say this, seemings are not beliefs; so they are non-doxastic mental states. Further, when formed in appropriate conditions, they are the foundations of the justification that considered normative judgments in his sense possess. Lastly, his foundationalism is modest since the justification that the seemings provide can be overridden, or undercut, by other considerations, as would happen if more general principles justified you in rejecting your initial considered judgment that being a member of our species is always in itself a reason to favor humans over animals in our actions. General principles are justified in part because they explain, or account for, these considered judgments and, I think Scanlon would agree, in part because on reflection they seem obviously true themselves.

Most epistemologists who think that intellectual (as opposed to perceptual) seemings are the foundations of a priori justification think either that they are seemings that some proposition is necessarily true (e.g., George Bealer and Laurence BonJour) or that they are based solely on understanding the proposition that is their object (my own view). These additional requirements are attempts to distinguish a priori from empirical justification and to handle the objection that its seeming obviously true is not always sufficient to provide justification for a proposition. Bealer says there is a difference between a physical intuition that a house undermined will fall and a rational (a priori) intuition that in Gettier cases a person with a justified true belief does not possess knowledge. One could object that it could seem obviously true to someone that a rock with his name on it is on the moon but that person would not be justified in believing that proposition simply on that basis even if his belief cohered with his other beliefs. But if justification requires not only that a proposition seem obviously true to someone in appropriate circumstances, but that it also appear necessarily true, or that the relevant seeming be based solely on understanding the proposition that is its object, then the rock-on-the-moon example would not be a counterexample to a view that takes such seemings as the foundations of justification. Scanlon thinks that his judgment that there is a rock on the moon with his name on it is not justified because it is not formed "under good conditions for arriving at judgments of the kind in question" (p. 82; his italics). Perhaps the good conditions for a priori justification require that the person base her beliefs solely on understanding the proposition at issue, so the view I am suggesting is just a further specification of what Scanlon says when applied to a priori justification.

And the justification of pure normative claims that Scanlon is interested in seems to be a priori justification, for he says, "It seems that we can discover normative truths and mathematical truths simply by thinking about these subjects in the right way" (p. 70). He also says we can come to know non-derivative truths about reasons "by thinking carefully about what seem to us to be reasons, considering what general principles about reasons would explain them, what implications these would have, and considering the plausibility of the implications of these principles" (p. 101).

So isn't Scanlon an intuitionist when it comes to the justification of pure normative claims, with intuitions justifying the basic beliefs and coherence considerations the derivative ones? Sometimes he wants to distance himself from reliance on intuitions (as opposed to considered judgments) because sometimes he understands them to be some sort of quasi-perceptual, mysterious way of coming in contact with some sort of "strange metaphysical truth-makers" (cf., pp. 70, 85). That is the understanding of intuitions that the critics of normative realism think the realists must accept, and they then criticize normative realism for having an implausible epistemology (Scanlon mentions J. L. Mackie in this regard, p. 70). But when discussing Mark Schroeder's views, Scanlon says that Schroeder's views should be "a reasonably extensional good fit with our firmest intuitive judgments about reasons" (p. 46; my italics). Here he seems to be using "intuitive judgments" in a different sense than the critics of normative realism and as a synonym for what he means by "considered judgments." Insofar as intuitionists take intuitions to be intellectual seemings (which is what Bealer calls them), intuitions play a crucial role in Scanlon's normative epistemology.

Scanlon claims that pure normative claims are normatively, but not conceptually, necessary, say, the claim that if x enjoys doing a in circumstances c (say, where the enjoyment is not obtained by making others suffer or through wrongdoing), then there is a reason for x to do a in c. But maybe such claims are conceptually necessary in a broad sense in the way that claims such as "no object can be red and green all over at the same time" and that "if A is taller than B and B is taller than C, then A is taller than C," are conceptually necessary because they are true in virtue of their meanings even though they are not analytic. To anyone who fully understands "taller than," the statement about "taller than" will seem obviously, maybe even necessarily, true solely in virtue of that understanding.


In his last lecture, Scanlon defends what he calls a non-atomistic view of reasons for action that denies that what a person has sufficient, or conclusive, reason to do is a function of how strong his desires are or how much pleasure or pain he will receive. He calls his view comparative and says, "The strength of a reason is an essentially comparative notion, understood only in relation to other particular reasons" (p. 111).

Earlier he says that he is a pluralist about reasons to act (pp. 101-02), thinking they cannot be reduced to one thing, say, to desire satisfaction or the sum of pleasures and pains for the agent. Suppose your action will give you pleasure (p. 102) or is needed for you to avoid serious physical pain (p. 85) or will relieve someone's suffering or is the keeping of a promise or what fairness requires. Then generally you will have some reason to do it. Of course, there will be exceptions: in some circumstances those considerations will not be sufficient or conclusive reasons to act, or even any reason to act (think of receiving pleasure through another's pain; cf., p. 102). Scanlon thinks that much normative reflection concerns discovering these exceptions, often through considering cases that evoke intuitions (or considered normative judgments) that constitute counterexamples to simpler views that do not include the relevant exceptions (that is, counterexamples to the conditionals that are the candidates for pure normative truths). He calls this, "clarifying what particular judgment we in fact accept" rather than "finding a separate principle that 'explains' this judgment" (p. 102; see, also, p. 32 where he says that much thinking about the reasons we have consists in thinking about the conditions under which some consideration is, and others where it is not, a reason to act. He notes how "a reason for" is vague (p. 32) and about reasons being "uncertain at the edges," p. 85). He is a defender of common sense (which holds that there are reasons for action such as enjoyment, the avoidance of pain, justice, promise keeping, the relief of suffering, etc.) and uses reflective equilibrium as a means in its defense and refinement.

Though there are some differences between Scanlon's meta-normative views and those of Derek Parfit in On What Matters, they share what I would call their normative realism and intuitionism. Their books differ in length and breadth (Scanlon's book being only 123 pages, leaving out the bibliography and index; Parfit's comprising two big volumes on a wider range of topics), but not in depth. Together they provide a much needed challenge to all forms of non-cognitivism and to what Parfit calls non-analytic naturalism, which treats normative and moral terms like natural kind terms such as "water" and "heat." They also represent a response to challenges to the epistemic weight of intuitions posed by the results of experimental philosophy. These are but some of the reasons philosophers have to take these books seriously and to change their meta-normative views if they are not already realists and intuitionists.