Belief and its Neutralization: Husserl's System of Phenomenology in Ideas I

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Brainard, Marcus, Belief and its Neutralization: Husserl's System of Phenomenology in Ideas I, State University of New York Press, 2002, 331pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-7914-5220-4.

Reviewed by Steven Crowell, Rice University


This book modestly labels itself “a structural analysis of and commentary on the first book of [Husserl’s] Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy” (xvii), and as such it is certainly the fullest and most faithful one we possess, delivering greater insight into Husserl’s intentions than similar works by Paul Ricoeur, Erazim Kohak, André de Muralt, and others. Yet the stakes of this project are anything but modest. Rather, Ideas I (as it is commonly known in the literature) proves to be the key to the “whole of Husserl’s thought” since it is its “beginning” (32) – not the first work Husserl wrote but the place where the single, fixed intention that governs Husserl’s thought through all its phases finds an “absolute” basis for its fulfillment (21). Marcus Brainard’s central claim is that in Ideas I Husserl “makes the first and the last attempt at a complete, systematic presentation of phenomenology itself” (29), and that the beginning made here is refined, but never abandoned, in Husserl’s later writings. Those familiar with recent Husserl-scholarship – which commonly reads Ideas I as a failed “Cartesian” attempt to introduce phenomenology, one that Husserl himself increasingly rejected – will recognize just what a challenge Brainard’s book represents.

Brainard is aware that his Husserl cuts a strange and unfashionable figure, but “the unpopularity of what Husserl actually thought” (27) is no excuse for turning it into something else. Indeed, one of the book’s tasks is to rescue Husserlian thought from the “oblivion” (225) into which it has fallen at the hands of the “phenom-enological movement” – Heideg-ger, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty, and more recent interpreters – which, under the guise of augmenting or developing the Husserlian project actually destroys and abandons it (219-225). The tool for this rescue attempt is provided by what Brainard (following Heribert Boeder) calls a “logotecton-ic epoché” (xvi): By “detemporalizing or denatural-izing thought, by wresting it away from all temporal and natural continua” – that is, by refusing to consider Husserl in light of contemporary or historical sources that may have influenced him, and by refusing to address questions to his thought that it does not pose to itself, however interesting they may be to us – the logotec-tonic epoché discloses Husserl’s thought as a “static whole,” as “the unity of a preceding, regulative intention” (xvii). Whatever objections one might raise to the idea of such a logotec-tonic epoché – and after several decades of hermeneutic criticism of intentionalism the reader will think of many – it cannot be denied that the aim of cultivating a “radical reticence with respect to thought” and the ethos of taking Husserl “at his word, listening all the while for its sense” (xvi) has paid off here. Brainard is able to show how the familiar concerns of phenomenology fit into a “system” whose elements have sometimes been noted but whose full scope has rarely been acknowledged. Whether this makes Husserl more attractive to contemporary readers is doubtful, but for Brainard irrelevant (225).

Drawing frequently on Husserl’s letters and unpublished works, Brainard sketches the outlines of this system in Chapter One. Phenomenology is not as such philosophy, but a wholly new discipline that has the task of securing the foundation upon which “all subsequent knowledge and all human endeavor” (xiii) can be based. The need for it arises not from some dispute internal to the philosophical tradition – in fact it “does not and, for principal reasons cannot, stand in any tradition” (14) – but from what Husserl calls the “crisis of reason,” the “life and death struggle between belief and unbelief, between universal philosophy and scepticism” whose symptoms are found in naturalism, positivism, and objectivism. Only on a phenomenolog-ical basis can “universal philosophy” eventually be achieved (7); Husserl’s thought therefore has a system as its goal, not as its beginning. It is not a “deductive” system, not “something finished,” but an “intuitive” and “founded system” that operates between a “lowermost limit” – the “pure ego” – and an “uppermost limit” – “absolute reason or God” (25). The task of thinking is to make a genuine beginning upon which, “stone by stone,” it can build, over generations, toward the knowledge of that which is “highest” and therefore “the ground, the root of everything” (23-24). In this, phenomenology mirrors the essence of the animale rationale, whose life is striving toward the telos of increasing rationalization (15). Because “all life is position-taking” – that is, belief – and therefore “subject to an ought [Sollen]” (15), the poles of the system are built into the very essence of life; a crisis of belief thus becomes a life-and-death matter.

The belief at issue here is not pistis, faith, but doxa, something far more basic that characterizes our overall stance in the world, the “natural attitude.” If a scientific path toward knowledge of God is to be found, it must pass through a mode of belief that cannot be shaken. Though belief in the world might appear to satisfy this condition, Husserl is convinced that it does not, and Brainard devotes Chapter Two to the hotly contested sections of Ideas I in which Husserl attempts to motivate this claim and delimit a kind of belief that in fact satisfies the condition. This requires clarification of two mainstays of phenomenolog-ical method – the eidetic reduction and the epoché – and since Brainard argues that Husserl never wavered in the principles of his method (58), his interpretation amounts to the unfashionable claim that Husserl remained strongly “essential-ist” and “foundationalist.”

Concerning the eidetic reduction Brainard cogently lays out Husserl’s argument that all factual, empirical sciences presuppose “sciences of essence” since empirical claims depend on conceptual necessities that cannot be derived from experience. Without the possibility of such knowledge, according to Husserl, science must ultimately fall victim to scepticism; but a merely logical, or argumentative, treatment of this problem oscillates endlessly between sceptical denial and dogmatic circularity. Thus Husserl invokes his “principle of all principles” – namely, the absolute right, as a source of justification, of what presents itself in intuitive Evidenz. By that standard, essences (necessities) are just as intuitable as are empirical things, and phenomenology – which is to be a “first” science and therefore an eidetic one – will proceed by intuition. However, to say that phenomenology is an eidetic science is not yet to specify its distinctive field of investigation. For this a “second reduction” is needed, one that “provides eidetic inquiry with its absolute ground, its direction, its sense” (36). This role is played by the epoché.

Brainard’s careful elucidation of the epoché and its motivation centers on the status of belief. In an elaborate series of reflections Husserl tries to show that our ordinary “natural attitude” – “the posit of or belief in the existence of the world” (60), a belief that is “unique and decisive” (61) because it enters into each belief directed toward things in the world – can and must be superseded in favor of a “phenomenological attitude” that reveals an epistemically prior and absolutely grounding “pure consciousness.” Starting with the character of belief as such, Husserl unpacks Descartes’ notion of universal doubt to show that a certain “modification” of believing consciousness is always possible – not one in which I doubt what I previously believed, but one in which I put that belief “out of play,” make no epistemic use of it, though it remains my belief so long as I have no reason to transform it into doubt. The epoché is such a “neutralization of belief.” But while any belief or set of beliefs can be neutralized, Brainard notes that a truly universal epoché would not serve Husserl’s purpose, since it would leave no “unmodified” region of belief upon which to establish a science of phenomenology (67-8). Why, then, does Husserl choose specifically to apply it to the “general thesis” of world-belief? Husserl’s text – and so Brainard’s commentary – is none too clear on this matter, but it is because Husserl understands world-belief in terms of a contrast between “transcendent” perception (in which consciousness grasps what is other than it) and “immanent” perception (in which consciousness grasps itself) and holds that neutralizing all transcendent (or worldly) belief will leave a sphere of immanent perception, or “pure consciousness,” as a “phenomenological residuum.”

Even if we grant such a distinction, however, why should pure consciousness be of particular interest to one seeking an absolute foundation for philosophy? Here Brainard leads us through the maze of paragraphs in which Husserl argues that what is perceived immanently not merely survives the epoché of world-belief, but is a region of “absolute being,” whereas the world has a merely “relative being” – indeed, is “nothing at all” beyond “something presented or something apparent in the manner peculiar to consciousness” (98). The key here, as Brainard points out, is Husserl’s epistemic claim that no transcendent perception excludes the possible non-existence of its object, whereas the existence of the object of immanent perception “cannot be doubted without leading to a countersense” (90). For Husserl, this epistemic difference seems to authorize an essential ontological distinction between consciousness and world, and further, an essential dependence of the latter on the former.

The nature of this dependence is the crux of all debates over the character of Husserl’s “idealism,” and though Brainard practices “reticence” with respect to such debates, his reconstruction has implications for them. For instance, he (279) explicitly rejects the view – advocated by J. N. Mohanty and others – that pure consciousness is not a region of “absolute being” but the ontologically neutral terrain of Sinn – a “region of sense” as Brainard himself calls it (101) – in which all modes of “being” are constituted. Brainard’s interpretation depends, however, on the claim that the neutralization of belief carried out in the epoché is an “annihiliation” (69) of the world in the same ontological sense in which Husserl speaks of a conceivable “annihilation of the world of physical things” in which the “existence [of consciousness] would not be touched” (Husserl, cited by Brainard, 97). Yet these are arguably two very different things. Nor is the fact that Husserl uses the term “absolute being” decisive here, since earlier drafts (and the published text itself) make it clear that the term is equivalent to “absolute givenness.” One reason for Brainard’s insistence on a strong ontological reading does, however, emerge in Chapter Three, where he presents Husserl’s attempt, following the application of the epoché, to lay out the main elements of the “lowermost limit of the system,” the field of pure consciousness.

Though occasionally this chapter lapses from clarifying commentary to something closer to paraphrase, in general it provides valuable guidance for approaching difficult topics such as intentional-ity, noesis/noema, modalization, synthesis (constitution), and expression. Husserl’s numerous and minute distinctions are expertly analyzed, and though the logotecto-nic method means that where Husserl is ambiguous so Brainard will be (for instance, on the question of whether the noema is some sort of representation or abstract entity), there are exciting and surprising insights throughout. One of these is Brainard’s argument – again, an unfashionable one – that the “pure ego” remains the “Archimedian point” (3) of phenomenology. Recent work in Husserl-studies has tended to downplay the importance of the egological level of constitution in favor of the supposedly more “primordial” pre-egological level of passivity, affectivity, embodiment, and the temporal streaming of experience itself. Brainard, in contrast, argues that in the absence of an ego in terms of which a distinction between “actional” and “potential” positings can be made, the pre-egological stream, though “infinite,” is neither actual nor potential (128). As Deleuze might say, it is merely “virtual” and thus no topic for phenomenological reflection. This helps explain Husserl’s dogged insistence, even in his latest writings, on preserving a central role for the individual transcendental ego – an insistence that is too often treated merely as vestigial “Cartesian-ism.”

The dramatic high-point of Brainard’s book is reached in Chapter Three as well, in a quite unlikely place. For in a little-studied set of paragraphs in which Husserl analyzes the so-called “neutrality modification”, Brainard locates a dire “threat” to the completion of Husserl’s system (its ascent to absolute reason or God) and so to the fate of humanity as such. Husserl is said to introduce the odd topic of a universal neutrality modification for the systematic reason that it defines the root of the crisis which has motivated the system all along (289). Brainard’s argument for this view is complex, but it can perhaps be sketched briefly. By this point in the text Husserl’s analyses have shown that belief is the “ground of productive conscious life” (30) – that is, that life’s striving toward reason by way of norm-governed scrutiny of its intentionally constituted world depends on “belief and the interest it entails” (180). Parallel to these basic “doxic” forms of consciousness, however, there is a “modification” in which, keeping the content the same, the belief-character of the act is “neutralized” – one example being the epoché itself, fantasy another. In such modes consciousness is “idle” (167), “inauthentic” (179), indifferent; positing nothing, it cannot be evaluated by reason (180). When Husserl points out the possibility of a universal neutrality modification affecting every positing act, then, this must, according to Brainard, have systematic significance – namely, as a diagnosis of the crisis of reason itself (32). At bottom, then, the crisis is not a belief in unreason, or even unbelief, but rather the possibility, inherent in life itself, that it will abandon productive striving altogether in favor of a universally neutral attitude toward all belief, an existence entirely in the dimension of the “as-if,” with no more commitment than one has toward the most idly entertained thought (161). Fortunately, it turns out that “even if the neutrality modification is able to stop the ego in its tracks … the stream – and thus time – continues to flow, which means that the ego continues to believe, if darkly” (170). Thus there is a way out of the crisis and Husserl can continue his ascent to reason. In a brief concluding chapter, Brainard nicely shows how reason is initially an adjectival modification of consciousness itself, a function of its evidential structure.

I confess that I am not convinced by Brainard’s argument for the importance of the neutrality modification for understanding the crisis that motivated Husserl’s thinking. First, if it were as central as Brainard says it is, it seems odd that Husserl never even alludes to the neutrality modification in any of his accounts of the crisis. More importantly, what Husserl calls the “crisis of reason” does not seem well-described by talk of an idle consciousness holding itself in a state of indifference with regard to its own life (which is not to say that there is no such state!). Rather, he seems to have in view an increase in the denial of reason and the embrace of unreason – for instance, in the rejection of “ideal norms.” This belongs in the arena of doxa and not neutrality. No matter how one decides this issue, however, the virtues of this bold, impressively researched, and unfailingly intelligent reflection on Ideas I will be plain to every serious reader.