Belief and Meaning: Essays at the Interface

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Hinzen, Wolfram, and Rott, Hans (eds.), Belief and Meaning: Essays at the Interface, Hansel-Hohenhausen, 2002, 252pp, 58 Euros (hbk), ISBN 1587506068.

Reviewed by Michael O'Rourke, University of Idaho


For a semantic theorist, belief and language are two important proving grounds. Belief systems and languages both provide agents with information about our world and influence our activity within it. More importantly, as many have noted, each provides a window on the other: holding belief content and utterances constant, we can solve for linguistic meaning; alternatively, holding linguistic meaning and utterances constant, we can solve for belief content. Given this, semantic theorists must pay heed to the relationship between belief and language, if only to argue that the suggested connections are misleading.

In Belief and Meaning: Essays at the Interface, Wolfram Hinzen and Hans Rott offer eleven essays that address the relationship between belief and linguistic meaning, giving “various answers to how theories of the one notion relate to theories of the other.” The editors go on to say that this collection should help determine “whether the two concepts of belief and of [linguistic] meaning are essential to one another, and how or whether they can be told apart” (vii). The collection is balanced between belief and language, with belief content being the primary focus in five essays and linguistic meaning being the focus in the other six. In all of the essays, though, the authors address implications for theories of the other sort of content. As a consequence, one can learn much about the interface from both directions.

The volume is divided into three sections. Part I, “The Syntax of Meaning,” includes three contributions that defend a syntactic, internalist approach to linguistic meaning and conceptual content. The four essays in Part II, “Belief, Meaning, and Truth,” present various perspectives on the nature and influence of belief content, with considerations of rationality and intentionality framing inquiries into belief change and belief’s role in a theory of linguistic meaning. Part III, “Semantics and Normativity,” is home to four essays that address the normative character of belief content and linguistic meaning, as well as normative elements in and constraints on semantic theory generally. The volume also includes a brief introductory overview by the editors, with Hinzen supplying further introductory material in the first half of his essay in Part I.

In what follows, I sketch the main argumentative conclusions of the essays and their connection to the overriding concern of the volume, viz., the theoretical association of belief content and linguistic meaning. These essays, of course, do not restrict their attention to a single theme, so in a second section I point to a number of related issues and distinctions illuminated by this volume.

I. An Overview

In his opening essay, “Meaning without Belief,” Wolfram Hinzen describes a spectrum along which we can locate theories of belief content and linguistic meaning. On one end stand those theories that regard belief content and linguistic meaning as “different and independent” (16). On the other, one finds theories that take them to be the same thing. In the middle are various theories that take linguistic meaning to depend on belief content, either methodologically or in a more substantive and fundamental way. This spectrum represents the principal theme addressed by essays in this volume, viz., the dependence of linguistic meaning on belief content.

The first group of essays stands at the “independence” end of the spectrum. This group presents a broadly Chomskyan case for a syntactic analysis of belief content and linguistic meaning. According to this brand of empirical internalism, concepts and languages are controlled by different but related cognitive subsystems. While in operation these subsystems can hardly be distinguished, they can be analyzed in isolation for theoretical purposes. This analysis is restricted to the internal grammars of the subsystems. In both places, meaning hypotheses are assessed relative to syntactic evidence, and, in particular, empirical evidence concerning the range of acceptable readings underwritten by grammatically approved structures. Thus, while facts about belief can inform theories of linguistic meaning, and vice versa, these are evidential and not conceptual relations. The semantic theory that results will be a scientifically respectable theory of the internal, syntactic constraints on interpretation and cognition.

Each essay in Part I makes methodological and substantive pronouncements. On the methodological side, the authors express convictions in line with those that set Chomsky apart from other, more traditional semantic theorists. Hinzen argues that language should be studied as a system, with mechanisms posited to account for linguistic meaning that is taken to be antecedent to and independent of belief or use. In “Does Every Sentence Like This Exhibit a Scope Ambiguity?”, Paul Pietroski and Norbert Hornstein contend that anyone who rejects the idea that “meanings of sentences are not individuated more finely than syntactic structures … owes a theory of the alleged nonsyntactic aspects of meaning” (66), where this requires empirical research and not just intuition mining. Turning to the mind, James McGilvray announces early in “MOPs: The Science of Concepts” that his aim is “serious science” of the mind, an internalist brand of empirical science that shuns notions such as intentionality or wide content. On the substantive side, Hinzen crafts a complex argument for the conclusion that rigidity as a feature of name-meaning is a syntactic phenomenon. Pietroski and Hornstein develop a compelling case against the claim that sentences like “Every girl pushed some truck” have a legitimate reading where ’some truck’ takes wide scope. McGilvray defends a Fodorian account of concept structure that is stripped of the externalist baggage of representationalism.

While the essays in Part I introduced us to the end of the spectrum where belief content and linguistic meaning are independent, Part II includes two essays that shift us to the opposite extreme. In “Meaning, Belief, and Truth,” Max Kölbel argues that one can supply a Davidson-style truth-conditional theory of meaning for language and avoid concerns about the limited reach of truth by replacing truth with belief as the central semantic concept. By contrast, Alberto Voltolini spends almost no time discussing language in “Why It Is Hard to Naturalize Attitude Aboutness,” choosing instead to focus on a characteristic feature of representational content, viz., intentionality. But it seems Voltolini would agree that this non-reducible “mental-or-semantic” feature of content is as much a part of linguistic meaning as belief content. Akeel Bilgrami’s essay, “Belief and Meaning,” presents a view that holds to the middle, as he insists that “it is not quite right” to identify belief and meaning (115n2). Even so, his argument for a world-responsive externalism built on an internalist foundation assumes that belief and meaning are closely related. Thus, when he urges us to reject “orthodox externalist doctrine about content” in favor of a single notion that makes an agent rational “by her own lights” without implying skepticism about the external world, he champions a thesis about both belief content and linguistic meaning (107-8).

The wild card essay in this part is Isaac Levi’s “Seeking Truth.” Like the others, it focuses on belief and in particular on “the question of seeking truth in changing beliefs” (125). In arguing that pragmatists can seek truth as a goal of inquiry, he defends the claim that “epistemological infallibilism is consistent with corrigibilism” (134) against challenges from Crispin Wright, Richard Rorty, and Donald Davidson. In the process, Levi suggests that a theorist concerned with inquiry and interpretation need have no “commerce with sense or meaning” (125). In fact, he seems to believe that there is little semantic work for linguistic meaning to do, and this suggests that belief and linguistic meaning should be treated as one topic and not two independent concerns.

In Part III, we shift focus from the relation of belief and meaning to a topic that concerns all who develop a theory along the spectrum, viz., the role of normativity in semantic theory. Theory construction in any domain is normative, if only because one must be sensitive to norms of logic and evidence. In the domain of meaning, though, many regard normativity as part of the problem; in particular, meanings are seen as normative constraints on use and interpretation. For its fans, normativity can figure into the construction of semantic theory in at least two ways: the theory could itself be normative, putting forth laws that govern the economy of contents, or it could be a descriptive account of meanings as normative.

In the first essay, “The Purpose of a Normative Account of the Content of our Beliefs,” Michael Esfeld develops an account of content that is normative, under pressure from rule-following considerations. One difficulty for such a theory is an ontological trilemma between reduction to non-normative considerations, excessive expansion of normativity, or elimination of normativity entirely. Esfeld supplies a first-person account of normative meaning that dissolves the trilemma. The second essay, “Semantic Structure of Belief and Meaning,” by Sebastian Rödl, serves up a social-pragmatist account of the structure of content that is pressed over neuroscientific and psychologistic alternatives. Rödl argues that semantic structure is the structure of the capacity to use and understand sentences, a capacity that is framed by sociocultural norms appropriate to the practice of language use.

By contrast with these normative accounts, the final two essays in Part III approach semantic normativity as a fact to be explained. Diego Marconi, in “The Normative Ingredient in Semantic Theory,” argues that semantic theories of the standard sort do not embed norms but they do obey them. Focusing on formal semantics, Marconi argues that “as a descriptive theory of semantic competence, [it] is informationally incomplete” (219), but informational completeness can only be gained at the cost of normative inadequacy, in particular, provision of the wrong truth conditions. Thus, if one assumes that there is a “norm to the effect that the semantic values of the descriptive constants ought not to be specified in an informative way,” one rationalizes its informational inadequacy by taking formal semantics to be “normatively-inspired”, even if it is not obviously a normative theory (225). In the final essay, “From Within and From Without: Two Perspectives on Analytic Sentences,” Olaf Müller presents a defense of “narrow analyticity” that is intended to capture our intuitive sense of analyticity while withstanding the Quinean critique. With this, he preserves a distinction that poses an important normative question to all language users: “Which sentences am I not permitted to reject—if I want to avoid talking nonsense?” (229).

II. An Evaluation

One measure of a good collection is the number of seminal papers. Most of the essays in this volume are either extensions of projects articulated in greater detail elsewhere, or are contributions to the necessary work of “normal science” within philosophy, i.e., the development of detail in broader theories. Relative to this measure, the collection does not fare very well, but on another it stands out, viz., the number of important themes and distinctions examined.

We have tracked the theme of the theoretical independence of linguistic meaning through the first two parts, and while the essays in Part III have a different emphasis, they can nevertheless be located along its spectrum. Both Esfeld and Rödl defend theses located near the dependence extreme, with Müller not too far away. Marconi, by contrast, views dependence as an obstacle, and so cleaves to the independence extreme. Turning from this theme, we have noted that Part III examines normativity in semantic theory, but again, the rest of the book is not mute on the topic. The essays in Part I contribute to a descriptive, scientific theory of belief and language, but in so doing staunchly support the methodological norm of “serious science.” Part II is a mixed bag. Bilgrami denies “the relevance of norms to word-meaning” (111), but the others are less explicit. Nevertheless, truth for Levi, belief for Kölbel, and intentionality for Voltolini all appear to play the role of normative constraint on semantic theory.

In addition to these prominent themes, several others receive close attention. Two substantive themes concern the nature of content. Well-represented is the debate between externalists who regard content as “outside the head” and internalists who take it to be exhaustively specifiable in narrow, cognitive terms. Voltolini, Esfeld, Rödl, and Marconi supply variations on the externalist theme, while the papers of Part I serve up three statements of internalism. Bilgrami addresses the debate most directly, and in so doing occupies middle ground, building an internalist externalism. Closely related to this is the debate between those who take content to be reducible to the physical, and those who deny that it is so reducible. The reductionist view is given initial expression in the first paragraph of the first essay, where Hinzen takes

the view that the human mind is a natural object that is not in principle investigated in a different way than the immune system, say, or the planetary system. When studying the human language system, we aim at explanatory principles and laws much as in the sciences of the body, hoping for an eventual integration with the core natural sciences. (13)

This view is echoed in Pietroski and Hornstein, and in McGilvray. On the opposite side is Voltolini, who argues that intentionality resists physicalist reduction. Esfeld and Rödl also toe the non-reductionist line, arguing that content is a non-reducible product of social practices.

On the side of methodology, the volume explores two distinctions that frame much of the philosophy of language. Is the proper theoretical approach to belief content and linguistic meaning one that takes them to be present in individual agents or distributed across groups of interrelated agents? The authors of Part I, along with Bilgrami, develop the former answer, while Esfeld and Rödl pursue the latter. A related question concerns the role of empirical considerations—should mind and meaning be treated as proper objects of scientific study, or should they be the subject of conceptual analysis, in the classic philosophical style? McGilvray champions the former view, arguing that “the aim should be a serious science” (73). Hinzen, along with Pietroski and Hornstein, join him in crafting arguments along these lines. A vocal exponent of the latter view is Esfeld, who contends that the theoretical point of this work “is not an empirical or psychological explanation of the capacity of thought, but a conceptual analysis of norms, content, and meaning” (193). The chorus of like-minded includes the remaining authors in the volume, with Rödl standing out as one who explicitly endorses this approach.

This collection presents a number of well-argued essays that cut across several important trends in contemporary philosophy. My chief complaint would be that Part III is rather one-sided. As constructed, it contains no essays that challenge the centrality of normativity to the investigation of meaning and content. The rest of the volume is even-handed, but the view of normativity held by those who believe that theories in this domain should aim at “descriptive and explanatory adequacy” (73) is not in evidence. This weakness, however, is overridden by a wealth of useful insight on a number of other theoretically interesting points.