Belief and Truth: A Skeptic Reading of Plato

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Katja Maria Vogt, Belief and Truth: A Skeptic Reading of Plato, Oxford University Press, 2012, 224pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199916818.

Reviewed by Deborah K. W. Modrak, University of Rochester


This book is not so much a skeptic reading of Plato as it is a skeptic reading of Ancient Greek philosophy. The book is very ambitious both in the scope of its topic and in the breadth and depth of the arguments it offers in defense of its overarching thesis. Vogt presents Hellenistic Pyrrhonism as the culmination of epistemological stances taken by Ancient Greek philosophers from Socrates to the Hellenistic Stoics and Epicureans. Not only is Pyrrhonian Skepticism a culmination of earlier philosophical tendencies, it is also, she believes, a compelling and convincing epistemological response to earlier and other Hellenistic philosophies. Vogt carefully builds a case for her reading starting with the Socratic dialogues, moving on to middle and later Plato and then looking at Hellenistic philosophy. This strategy leads to an interesting and philosophically well-informed exploration of various texts. It also leads to many controversial textual interpretations. Finally, even if Vogt is correct about how Sextus read the history of Ancient Greek epistemology, her approach raises the question of whether he got it right.

Vogt's Introduction makes a claim that is central to her interpretation of Ancient Greek epistemology: doxa (translated "belief" by her) is a deficient cognitive attitude that is not in any way to be considered a component of or an implication of knowledge. She attributes this conception of belief to Socrates, and believes it explains his caution about accepting falsehoods. His reluctance should be read as a caution against accepting beliefs, which are deficient truth claims (19). The first chapter continues to develop this theme by arguing that Plato identifies ignorance with self-aggrandizing modes of thought in the Apology, Ion and Philebus. Vogt interprets Socrates' profession of ignorance in the Apology as the claim that "the things I do not know are the fine/great things" (38). Socrates knows mundane things including propositions about the wrongness of specific actions but this does not make him "an expert in anything." It does allow him to have the human wisdom he claims to have (41). While this solves the Knowledge Puzzle, as Vogt calls it, it does so by introducing a distinction between kinds of knowledge viz. expert and non-expert knowledge. Apart from the puzzle she is trying to solve, there seems to be little textual evidence in Socratic dialogues for this distinction. In the Ion, what is wrong with the rhapsode Ion's lack of understanding is not that it is ignorance but that it is self-aggrandizing ignorance. Similarly according to Vogt, Plato's target in the Philebus is ignorance that is blameworthy because it is self-aggrandizing.

The second chapter turns to the distinction between belief and knowledge in Republic V. Vogt argues against Fine's interpretation of the relationship between perception and knowledge. She defends a reading according to which Plato differentiates between three kinds of beliefs, viz. beliefs about objects of belief, beliefs without knowledge about intelligible objects and beliefs with knowledge about intelligible objects (51). In the last case, belief is still distinct from knowledge because it only deficiently acquaints us with its intelligible object. This type of belief is implicit in Plato's use of similes, she argues, and it enables Plato to allow beliefs a role in investigation while maintaining a rigid distinction between belief and knowledge.

In the third chapter, Vogt discusses the Theaetetus and finds evidence there for another crucial part of her interpretation: for the Ancients there are not two kinds of beliefs, namely, true and false ones; there is only one kind, namely belief as a deficient cognitive attitude. Plato entertains the two-kinds view for the sake of argument when he considers whether knowledge is true belief, she maintains, but his handling of the Jury case, makes it clear that he rejects the two-kinds view. As Vogt puts it, the "refutation of DEF II, then rests on the point that a true belief is not known to be true to the cognizer, who has it" (91). Even if granted, it is hard to see why this point would count against the two-kinds view. Undeniably, the rejection of the definition of knowledge as true belief does point to the requirement that something other than mere truth is needed for knowledge.

The fourth through eighth chapters deal primarily with Hellenistic Pyrrhonism. According to Vogt, there are two responses possible for a philosopher confronted with conflicting appearances, viz. relativism and skepticism. Sextus's skepticism, she argues, "reinvigorates a Socratic intuition: if there are conflicting appearances, or if one cannot figure something out, one should continue to investigate" (97). Protagorean relativism is rejected by the Pyrrhonists in favor of skepticism. The rational response to disagreement (conflicting appearances) is to suspend judgment.

In chapter five, Vogt fills out her account of skeptical investigation. It is, contrary to what many critics have charged, possible for the Pyrrhonian to conduct investigation that is guided by epistemic norms responding to the value of truth. All three Hellenistic philosophical schools are committed to the epistemic value that it is better to form no belief at all than one that could be false (133-38). Because the dogmatists share this value with the skeptics, the Pyrrhonian can investigate in accord with it without committing to believing anything.

Chapter six continues to develop the thesis that the skeptics need not be committed to beliefs. Vogt explores what she calls the Concept Charge against skepticism: thought involves concepts and concepts involve beliefs but the skeptics deny that they have any beliefs. Moreover, skeptical investigation involves thought and, seemingly, concepts (conceptions of how things are). Vogt frames her defense of the skeptics by noting that "much of what the skeptics say about themselves is cast in the conceptual framework of their interlocutors" (143). The Stoics and Epicureans have a developed account of preconceptions. The skeptics are entitled to use concepts because they adopt this account of preconceptions. According to the Stoics and Epicureans, preconceptions arise naturally and do not involve active assent (156). This is an ingenious defense of Sextus. It runs the risk, however, of making Pyrrhonian skepticism unintelligible except within a framework provided by the Hellenistic dogmatists.

Chapter eight adds to the defense of skepticism an argument that, according to the Stoics, beliefs are never true. This is because beliefs are weak and changeable assents whereas knowledge is firm assent. Vogt draws much of her evidence for this analysis from texts describing the Stoic sage's character and state of mind. The sage never assents to anything non-cognitive. The sage possesses knowledge; knowledge is identified by the Stoics with the truth, which is comprehensive and exhaustive; knowledge is not the mere possession of one or more true cognitions. All of this can be granted, it seems to me, without granting that beliefs for the Stoics are neither true nor false, which is central to Vogt's reading. She admits that since, for the Stoics, the propositional content of a belief as expressed in an utterance is true or false, it is odd to deny that the belief is true, but she insists this is their position. As a weak assent to an impression, belief is governed by norms that are distinct from truth-bearing. (182).

The final chapter summarizes the objective of the book: to map "out core ingredients of the mix of philosophical ideas relevant to Pyrrhonism" from Socratic wisdom to the Stoic conception of belief (184). Vogt goes on to argue that confronted with conflicting appearances a philosopher would do well to embrace skeptical investigation that stops short of making truth claims.

Vogt's book is very ambitious. It is provocative and certainly deserves serious study. Its greatest strength is a clear conception of the skeptical epistemology that Vogt defends throughout. According to her, knowledge and belief are two distinct kinds of cognitive attitudes. The former makes a truth claim whereas the latter makes a deficient truth claim. Having knowledge is totally independent of having beliefs, i.e., it does not follow from 'I know that p' that 'I believe that p'. On the contrary, if I believe that p, I do not know that p. When a cognizer is uncertain whether she has knowledge or only belief, she should suspend judgment and continue to investigate. A corollary to this conception of belief and knowledge is that there are not two kinds of beliefs, true beliefs and false ones, but only one kind: that of being a deficient cognitive attitude. Vogt's analysis is systematic and intricate as she defends interpretations of specific texts that become part of the mosaic of her analysis of Ancient epistemology. Even for a reader, who finds herself questioning parts of Vogt's analysis, the effort to engage with the thesis of this book is well worth the effort involved. A person comes away from Belief and Truth with a deeper understanding of Ancient epistemology, even if that understanding differs from Vogt's.

There are reasons, I believe, to be cautious about attributing the epistemological stances identified by Vogt to many Ancient Greek philosophers. I have several concerns. One is about her view that beliefs are not only deficient but also play a role in conceptual thought. This is a difficult picture to fill out in a way that is consistent with the claim that belief is such that it cannot possibly be a component of knowledge. Now of course the problem could be that of the Ancient epistemologists who subscribed to this picture of concept formation and belief. But I am inclined, for the sake of charity, to look for a conception of the role of concepts in thought and belief that is coherent and for which there is textual support. According to Vogt the world acts on a cognizer causing her to have various impressions (beliefs). Suppose it is snowing and the cognizer has an impression of snow as cold. Now what is the relation between the conception of snow and the conception of cold? On Vogt's picture, we cannot say that the concept of snow contains (entails) that of cold. Entailment relations hold in the sphere of truth-bearing but beliefs have no truth-value. Arguably, this puzzle would challenge Vogt's account of the role belief plays in skeptical investigation. If beliefs lack truth-values, it is very hard to see how any kind of inferential reasoning can be based upon them, even reasoning that leads to the suspension of judgment. What seems to have gone wrong is a conflation of the assignment of truth-values with the justification of the assignment. If these are kept separate, then a skeptic may reason from beliefs she takes for the sake of argument to be true, without committing to holding that these beliefs are indeed true because they are justified and known to be true.

Even more problematic, I believe, is the position Vogt attributes to the Stoics in order to maintain her claim that conceptual thought does not involve beliefs that are truth-bearers. A rational impression for the Stoics is an impression that involves a cognizing of a lekton (sayable). Propositions are complete lekta (sayables). A rational impression is an impression that relates the cognizer to a lekton; i.e., the rational impression has a propositional content. Vogt does not deny this but instead insists that as long as the lekton is an object of thought, it is propositional but non-truth bearing; it is not the right kind of object to be either true or false. Only when the lekton is uttered is it a truth bearer (176). Then what are we to say about the lekton that p, which is not true as an object of thought but becomes true or false when a speaker asserts that p? If we say it is the very same proposition p in both cases we have the challenge of making sense of a notion of proposition in which the very same proposition is sometimes a truth-bearer and sometimes not. If we say that the proposition that p is transformed in the utterance, then strictly speaking, there would be two propositions p' and p" involved and the origin of p' in the world's impressing p' upon the cognizer would no longer hold of p". There is, so far as I can see, next to no evidence for attributing this very problematic account to the Stoics.

A related difficulty is Vogt's denial that beliefs are true or false. She supports this finding by appealing to evidence that some Ancient thinkers distinguished between knowledge and belief and held that knowledge transforms belief. But this conclusion seems to be drawn too quickly. An epistemologist who believes that knowledge is justified true belief can grant that adding a justification to the belief transforms it into knowledge. This is fully compatible with the belief's being true and with our saying that knowledge entails belief. There is little reason to think that Ancient philosophers would not have been able to see this point and hence little reason to attribute to them the view that beliefs are neither true nor false, if they distinguish between knowledge and belief. A case in point is Plato's rejection of the definition of knowledge as true belief in the Theaetetus in favor of the definition of knowledge as true belief with an account (logos). Although the last definition is also ultimately rejected, Plato's moving from the second to the third definitions suggests that he is not troubled by the implication that beliefs are either true or false or by the implication that knowledge implies belief.

To end on a well-deserved positive note: Vogt's interpretation of Pyrrhonian skepticism and her interpretation of Sextus' understanding of his philosophical predecessors and contemporaries are nuanced and persuasive. Her reading of the history of Ancient epistemology is Pyrrhonian and therein lies both the strengths and weaknesses of her thought-provoking book. Modern skeptics will no doubt find in Vogt's sympathetic rendering of Ancient Greek skeptical thought much that is relevant to contemporary discussions.