Believing Against the Evidence: Agency and the Ethics of Belief

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Miriam Schleifer McCormick, Believing Against the Evidence: Agency and the Ethics of Belief, Routledge, 2015, 144pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415818841.

Reviewed by Peter J. Graham, University of California, Riverside


Some philosophers hold that truth, knowledge and rationality are valuable for their own sake. Some hold that we ought to believe only on the evidence, where this "ought" arises independently of morality and prudence. There is something normatively autonomous about belief, truth, knowledge and evidence. Miriam Schleifer McCormick disagrees. Her central contention in her provocative and dialectically engaging book is that the norms or ethics of action and the norms or ethics of belief are not separate but unified, that belief is just as much a part of our agency as action.

The book has two parts: "Doxastic Norms" and "Doxastic Responsibility." Part I proceeds as a dialectical encounter with a number of evidentialists: Jonathan Adler, David Velleman, Ralph Wedgwood, Nishi Shah, and Richard Feldman, among others. Part II also proceeds as a dialectical encounter, but not necessarily with evidentialists: Carl Ginet, David Owens, Pamela Heironymi, and Angela Smith, among others.

Part I unifies belief and action by unifying the source of their normativity. Part II unifies belief and action by bringing both under our direct control. In both parts McCormick sets out to undermine apparent distinctions between theoretical and practical reasoning. In the end she thinks there is no clear reason to posit "two different kinds of reasoning."

To unify the source of normativity in Part I, McCormick asserts that the ultimate, non-instrumental good (for humans) is individual and collective flourishing. She then argues that truth and knowledge are not per se goods, for even if some truth and knowledge are constituents of flourishing, it does not follow that all true beliefs are good. Similarly, some social relations are necessary for our flourishing, but not all social relations are good. Furthermore, a world where truth and knowledge do not contribute to flourishing might exist. Truth and knowledge would then not be good at all.

Nevertheless, truth and knowledge are still very valuable. Following Hilary Kornblith, McCormick asserts that believing on the evidence is usually a very good thing, for evidence is our guide to the truth, and we are more likely to achieve our goals and live flourishing lives, both individually and collectively, if we form true beliefs. We all have a hypothetical reason for wanting to have belief-forming capacities that reliably induce true beliefs. The "only way to make sense of epistemic value . . . is to . . . ground it" in individual and collective flourishing, in the practical and the moral.

The result is normative unity. "Thinking about why we value truth and knowledge reveals that the norms guiding us . . . in the epistemic realm are not isolated from other normative domains . . . .epistemic value is not autonomous from other values." The source of normativity for beliefs and actions is the same."

Clifford was then nearly right about the ethics of belief. "I think that in most cases," McCormick writes, "we should not deviate from evidentialist principles. Most of the time, if one believes against the evidence, one is doing something wrong." It "tends to be harmful, both to individuals and to the collective." Acceptable "deviations from evidentialist norms should be rare." McCormick would thus concur with the spirit of evidentialism: one ought to believe on the evidence.

But McCormick is a pragmatist at heart, for she believes it is sometimes permissible to believe against the evidence. My doctor tells me I might die of cancer. However, if I believe I will survive -- against the odds -- then my chances increase. Shouldn't I believe?

When are deviations permissible? Only when the agent is not ignoring, suppressing, or deliberately failing to attend to evidence. Clifford's ship owner was clearly in the wrong. Furthermore, following John Bishop, deviations are permissible only when the agent's motivation and the content of the belief are morally permissible.

Permissible deviations include: meaning-making beliefs (beliefs about the significance and meaning in life events, for they "enrich our lives and help us thrive"); inescapable framework beliefs (that, if not based on evidence, such as the external world exists or that my children are not automata, are essential for sanely living our lives, and so permissible); beliefs about loved ones (it is fine to weigh the evidence with different standards than otherwise); and religious belief (provided it is not so specific -- belief in the God of Abraham is ruled out as going too far against the evidence). Given the same normative basis, exceptions to evidentialist dicta are sometimes acceptable.

McCormick is not yet finished making her case for unity, for one of the main reasons for rejecting pragmatism about the norms for belief is the apparent impossibility of voluntary control over what we believe. Our beliefs seem determined by the evidence, and so the very idea of believing against or without evidence seems impossible. The norms of belief cannot be assimilated to the norms of agency, for there is no such thing as doxastic agency.

McCormick takes up this challenge in Part II. Everyone agrees that we can indirectly cause ourselves to believe things. As Pascal brought to our attention, if it is good to believe something and the evidence doesn't induce the belief, you can take actions that will lead to the belief you want to have. But the question whether to bring about beliefs that way falls under the norms of action, for we bring them about indirectly through action. To unify the norms of belief and action, as McCormick intends, she needs to show how beliefs and actions both fall under norms of agency in general.

One strategy would be to embrace doxastic voluntarism, the thesis that intentions can directly bring about beliefs in the same way intentions can directly bring about actions. McCormick repeatedly rejects this idea, along with almost everyone else. We don't have direct, voluntary control over belief. We can voluntarily raise our arms; we can't voluntarily believe it is raining. Judging that it would be good to raise our arm moves our arm; judging that it would be good to believe that it is raining does not move our minds.

But this does not mean, McCormick argues, that we don't directly control our beliefs, that our beliefs are not expressions of our agency. Exercising voluntary control and exercising agency are not equivalent. According to McCormick we exercise agency in believing when we take responsibility or take ownership for our belief-forming mechanisms. How do we do that?

There are two parts to her idea. The first involves the capacity to change our first-order attitudes -- both beliefs and intentions -- as a result of reflection. Consider beliefs from perception and memory. I might become aware on reflection that a perceptual belief or a memorial belief is based on misleading evidence, that my evidential standards are too low, or that I failed to monitor for misleading evidence or malfunctions. When this happens, I often change or suspend the belief in question. When my higher-order judgment that I ought to change my mind changes my mind, then reflection guided my first-order judgment. On the basis of reasons I am aware of under reflection, I can guide my belief-forming mechanisms. I then have the capacity to directly control my beliefs. Direct control is possible without direct voluntary control.

The second part involves taking responsibility for exercising this capacity. This means internalizing socially inculcated standards of adequacy in belief-formation. This involves seeing myself as a fair target of praise and blame -- a fair target of the reactive attitudes -- for not meeting those standards. And so in cases where I recognize that I ought not believe something, I will often feel guilty or shameful for concluding as I did. If I hastily reach a conclusion on equivocal evidence and you later catch my error, I will feel guilty, judge that I should change my mind, and do so as a result. So being responsible involves taking responsibility, and that involves an internalized sense that I ought to believe on adequate evidence, monitor for abnormalities and misleading evidence, and change what I believe on the basis of reflective judgments about the evidence.

McCormick argues we are responsible in the same way for actions. We have the same capacity to guide our actions by reflection, a capacity we have taken responsibility to exercise. McCormick then concludes that beliefs, just like actions, are expressions of our agency, and doxastic responsibility isn't a different kind of responsibility than our responsibility for actions.

McCormick reaches two intriguing conclusions: the source of normativity for belief and action is the same, and we exert a kind of control that grounds responsibility that is the same in both cases. Part II, just like Part I, unifies belief and action.

McCormick concludes doubting the distinction between theoretical and practical reasoning altogether.

Why does it seem so obvious to philosophers that there is a distinction between practical and theoretical reasoning? … I accept that we reason about different kinds of issues. But I do not see why we need to posit two different kinds of reasoning. Reasoning about theoretical issues and practical issues is often overlapping and intertwined.

Questions about what is true influence what is good to do, and questions about what is good influence what we should believe is true.

I want to push back on the strength or scope of McCormick's conclusions. I want to push back on the implication that we should doubt fundamental normative and structural differences between belief and action from her two intriguing conclusions. I shall do so by thinking about another normative domain: the biological well functioning of our bodily organs.

Here's what I have in mind. Our bodies have a number of systems with various organs as constituents. Altogether they contribute to our individual survival and reproduction (to our individual and collective flourishing). So the ultimate normative basis for the norms governing our systems and organs is the same in each case. Does it follow, however, that the norms for the heart, the mouth, the hands, the immune system, our reproductive organs, and so on, are the same? The ultimate normative basis is the same, but are the norms the same?

I think there is a clear sense of the question in which the answer is clearly no. The function of the heart is to pump blood, and among the functions of the mouth are talking and eating. They both have very different functions, and so insofar as functions set standards of evaluation, and insofar as standards of evaluation are norms, they are governed by different norms. The norms for the heart and the norms for hand differ. Furthermore, what counts as normal or proper operation of these organs -- the way they should work or operate in order to fulfill their functions -- clearly differs as well. And insofar as the standards for proper operation set norms, these norms differ too. So from the fact that the ultimate normative basis is the same -- from the fact that the heart and the mouth would have no function at all if not for their contributions to individual and collective flourishing -- it simply does not follow that, in every sense, the norms for both are exactly same. Indeed, they clearly differ.

We can thus accept the argumentation that leads to McCormick's first major thesis that the ultimate normative basis for belief and action is the same without accepting that the norms for belief and action are the same. Belief and action may work very differently and have different functions, and so be governed by different norms, even if they have the same ultimate normative basis. Their ultimate ends might be the same even without all of their ends being the same.

Which brings me to issue of reflective control. Can we control our organs? We can indirectly control their operation -- exercise, food, exposure to the elements, and so on, can all influence how they work or operate. We can negatively directly control the operation of some of our organs. I can stop breathing, at least for a while. I can wait in line for the restroom, though not forever. I can close my eyes and plug my ears. And we can directly control other organs. I directly control my arms, my legs, my mouth and so on. So we have a variety of forms of control over some, if not all, of our organs.

Does it follow that if I have the same form of control over two organs that the two organs do not really differ in kind? Does it somehow follow that the two organs don't work or operate in different ways or have different norms appropriate for their evaluation? Not at all. So from the premise that we enjoy a kind of direct guidance control through reflection over belief and action, a kind of control that grounds our responsibility over belief and action in both cases, not much follows about the differences or similarities between theoretical and practical reasoning.

When concluding, McCormick makes a strong point that theoretical and practical reasoning work in tandem, often overlapping and intertwined. Should we conclude that there is only one capacity -- reasoning -- with the function of contributing to individual and collective flourishing? Again I don't think so, for the same reason that all of our organs, though with different structures, ontologies and functions, must work together for our overall good. The structure, ontology, and function of belief may differ fundamentally from action. As she admits, we have voluntary control over action that we lack over belief. That's one difference. Other philosophers have argued for more.

McCormick does an outstanding job drawing our attention to questions about the ultimate basis for epistemic normativity and the extent of our control over belief. She's made a convincing case that the case for the autonomy of the epistemic in the normative domain is not so easily made. I've come to seriously doubt it myself. And she is surely right to explore the extent of our agency and the nature of our responsibility in belief, to see parallels between belief and action where others only see differences. But has she persuaded me that theoretical and practical reasoning are not different kinds of reasoning or that the norms for both are essentially the same? Not yet. Their functions and their structures, as far as I can tell, may yet be fundamentally different even if both are expressions of our agency.