Believing by Faith: An Essay in the Epistemology and Ethics of Religious Belief

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John Bishop, Believing by Faith: An Essay in the Epistemology and Ethics of Religious Belief, Oxford University Press, 2007, 250pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199205547.
Reviewed by:

Reviewed by Phillip H. Wiebe, Trinity Western University


Bishop revives the idea advanced by William James more than a century ago of following one's passions in religion when intellectual issues cannot be decided. Bishop offers a sophisticated statement of the conditions necessary for a responsible act of "taking as true" some claim for which evidence is incomplete or ambiguous, and in the course of so doing not only engages some recent interpretations of faith in James's famous "The Will to Believe," but also clarifies recent advocacy of the view that belief in the existence of God can be properly basic. He describes the book as arising out of an attempt to examine alternative concepts of God to the classical one in which God is considered to be the "supernatural, omnipotent, omniscience, omnibenevolent Creator ex nihilo" -- the omniGod" (p. ix). Although he keeps classical theism in view, Bishop attempts to set out conditions for embracing virtually any theistic stance. His frequent reference to evangelical Christian faith, which requires putting faith in God as revealed in Jesus the Christ, suggests that he expects this version of theism to be familiar to his readers. Evangelical Christianity arouses strong passions -- for and against -- and it is often presented by adherents as something one might "believe by faith," so it serves Bishop's objectives. I will return to this topic.

One of the merits of Bishop's work is his drawing attention to the felt difference in human experience between such broadly cognitive-affective states as taking a claim to be true in practical reasoning, and other related states of mind such as believing a claim, trusting it, and accepting it (35-41). His discussion of the limited circumstances under which we can generate beliefs lends credence to the view that a central concept in understanding religious commitments is holding claims as true, rather than believing them. Bishop's phenomenological analysis of human acts belonging to religion adds to the knowledge of ourselves as unique, natural agents. Bishop is not the first to draw attention to important distinctions embedded in facile uses of such terms as 'faith' and 'believe', but his remarks strike me as especially insightful. The title of the book might lead one to expect an articulation of religion using these overused terms, but he does so without them. "Believing by faith" is not an effort expended in order to "make oneself believe" some claim for which the evidence is inconclusive, but consists of taking a claim to be true for practical purposes. This is the fideism that Bishop defends for those he describes as "reflective believers," that is, people who are interested in justifying their religious acts.

A distinctive feature of Bishop's work is his argument that the act of taking some claim to be true for practical purposes requires more than an appeal to epistemic principles in order to be adequately assessed, for taking something to be true is an act, and as such is subject to moral evaluation. Bishop thus injects the significance of morality into the assessment of "believing by faith," and rejects the supposed superiority of "hard-line evidentialism" which asserts that when evidence is indecisive we should not act. Hard-line evidentialists think that yielding to our passions where evidence is indecisive, especially when religion is involved, is profoundly irrational, but Bishop argues that we might come to particular insights concerning religion (and other matters, such as interpersonal relationships) only by yielding to our passions (191). He observes that St Augustine maintained that we can understand certain matters only if we proceed in the opening of ourselves (224). Bishop notes that evidentialists and fideists at least agree on one point: that following one's passions where evidence is inconclusive is epistemically responsible only if such fideism can lead us to otherwise unobtainable and valuable truths; however, they disagree over whether fideism is capable of finding such truths (195). This is a disagreement that only empirical evidence can settle. Questions about such ultimacies as final truths and epistemic procedures are in evidence everywhere in Bishop's extended argument, and they bring to the surface the problems in justifying justificatory strategies themselves. He grants that yielding to passional interests involves some epistemic principles, such as ensuring that such interests are not only consistent with themselves, but also compatible with factual beliefs and open to being altered (208f); however, fideism cannot be defended on epistemic principles alone. Bishop construes Reformed epistemology as a form of fideism in denial, and suggests that it cannot really provide a justification for theism, in particular, Christian theism, for it favors this theism only if Christian beliefs are true (196-7), which is deemed to be beyond the reach of evidence.

Bishop's attempt to shift the ground over religion from epistemology to ethics yields uncertain results. He is correct in observing that a decision to act upon some theistic hypothesis is subject to moral evaluation, but the same can be said for choosing to use a fallacious argument to advance a position, or for recommending an art object for purchase in spite of its being inferior. In each of these cases some non-moral evaluative category historically belonging to philosophy -- here, logic and aesthetics, respectively -- is operative, and is arguably more important than the acts involved, admittedly subject to moral evaluation. If someone uses a fallacious argument to defend a position, for instance, the fact that the argument is fallacious is at least of as much interest as is the fact that someone has chosen this dubious method of arguing. If the person knowingly uses a fallacious argument in an effort to deceive a naïve person, we will think poorly of the arguer, but the central point is that a fallacious argument has been used, not that someone knowingly used it. I am not suggesting that moral considerations are insignificant in comparison with logical, aesthetic, or epistemological ones, but simply that the latter might be of at least as much importance as the moral one. Inasmuch as some complex event can trigger evaluative responses from numerous domains that philosophy has made its subject-matter, some over-arching scheme is required that considers every relevant evaluative perspective and (tentatively) ranks them. The following kinds of evaluations immediately come to mind: logical, aesthetic, epistemological, moral, metaphysical, legal, self-interested, concerning intrinsic value, concerning etiquette, and religious. Each of these has its own "ought," each its rules and justificatory procedures, each its unique ways of feeling, and so on. Philosophy does not appear to me to have addressed this extraordinarily demanding desideratum, but Bishop's argument requires something of the sort.

The fideist that Bishop has in mind is a very agreeable, tolerant, and reflective person who is drawn to some theistic hypothesis, and even though relevant evidence is ambiguous, she thinks that she might miss something in life -- some truth -- by not following it. This fideist is actually self-interested, which Bishop's remarks about the values of self-acceptance and authenticity corroborate (216f). Perhaps this is no great matter, since self-interested perspectives often coincide with moral ones. Imagine a fideist who is finicky about his body, however, who is also drawn (maybe as a result) to a form of theism that considers such medical procedures as blood transfusions and organ donations to be violations of divine law. Embracing this faith would in fact fulfill his passional interests and make his life more authentic. But now imagine this authentic theist baulking at being an organ donor for his dying daughter. The conflict between self-interest and morality is obvious. Bishop presents the justificatory grounds for preferring fideism over hard-line evidentialism as moral ones, but they strike me as being significantly colored by self-interest.

Bishop consistently supposes that the indecisive evidence concerning theistic claims is the total evidence. The question of what counts as evidence for hypotheses, and the related question of the weight of such evidence, are unsolved problems in philosophy, in spite of extensive debate in the latter half of the 20th century, largely precipitated by the work of Carl Hempel, Rudolf Carnap, and Karl Popper. Hempel argued that common intuitions about evidence were mistaken, such as the common belief that finding a white shoe was irrelevant to the claim that all ravens are black. The work of all these theorists is controversial in one way or another. Bishop's supposition about total evidence -- which many other philosophers also make -- involves a capacity for knowledge that approaches omniscience, since knowledge is presupposed of fine distinctions between irrelevant evidence reports and various shades of confirming or undermining evidence; moreover, this knowledge of evidence covers all events in the universe's entire history. Assessing the plausibility of theism, whose many forms will include some in which an omniscient being is advanced, on the assumption of virtual omniscience is ostensibly to stack the deck. Bishop's reference to total evidence brings a paralyzing uncertainty into the discussion; I suggest that we would do better to try to handle the evidence we (think we) have, however meager or plentiful, than to speculate on the basis of "total evidence."

We might wonder what kind of truth a fideist might discover that would lead her to conclude that her fideism either contributed to, or at least preceded, its discovery. If the "truth" that is found is of a kind that features only "subjective" characteristics that change only her convictions, this "truth" will compare unfavorably with that deriving from our interaction with the intersubjectively observable world, and is liable to be rejected as truth. On the other hand, if the truth that the fideist uncovers is of an objective nature, the claim that the total evidence for theism is indecisive appears mistaken. Is some profound discovery about the structure of the universe waiting to be uncovered that will convince all present-day skeptics and all "half-believers?" One possible source of additional evidence for theism is religious experience, to which William James's contribution, The Varieties of Religious Experience, is even more famous than his essay on faith. Bishop acknowledges that "putative post-mortem existence," might tip the balance in favor of fideism, thereby indicating his interest in religious experience as evidence.

Some time ago I undertook research on contemporary visions or apparitions of Jesus, the results of which suggest some evidence for a link between Bishop's "taking some claim as true" and events that seemingly arise from, or at least follow, this act. My study described the experiences of twenty-eight living people using eighteen phenomenological variables and other demographic ones. As one might expect, many of these percipients had experiences to which no others were privy. Joy Kinsey, for example, reported an experience that followed her decision during a church service "to kneel and pray and just really totally surrender [her] will to God for whatever purpose" (Visions of Jesus, OUP 1997, p. 43). A minister came over to pray with her, and upon doing so, Joy lost consciousness and did not regain it for about three hours. During this time she had a "vision" of Jesus, who not only spoke to her about impediments to holiness, but also offered her a renewed life, symbolized by a goblet of wine that she was instructed to drink. When she "drank the wine" (in her unconscious state) Jesus raised his hand in a parting gesture of blessing, and Joy regained consciousness. She discovered that people around her were in a state of consternation because of the strong aroma of sweet wine coming from her mouth. This smell apparently permeated the church, and Joy felt so "drunk" that she needed two people to hold her up. Although Joy did not explicitly describe her cognitive-affective state that preceded her request for prayer as an instance of "believing by faith" as Bishop understands it, this phrase might be applicable to her. Joy's possible "believing by faith" appears to have uncovered truths (for her) that might not be otherwise accessible, although the strange smell that came from Joy and her "drunkenness" suggests that its epistemic aspects might be more than subjective. In researching the link between "believing by faith" and events to which they ostensibly lead, we would need to ensure that subjects did not try to bring about the events that would uphold the conjectured causal relationship; we might do well to examine the experiences of subjects who report them in their own words and are unaware of the link under scrutiny.

Several visionaries I interviewed reported experiences that allegedly penetrated the space-time-causal world. One was Barry Dyck, who was hospitalized because of three broken neck vertebrae from a skiing accident. Barry reported that eight days after his accident a luminous figure appeared at the end of his hospital bed that he identified as Jesus Christ. Barry impulsively -- he was only eighteen -- grasped the forearms of this being and begged to die, since his pain was unbearable. Barry was informed in wordless communication that this petition would not be granted, and he awoke the next morning to find that his pain and swelling were gone. Instead of being in a neck-brace for the next eleven months, as doctors expected, Barry resumed his regimen of running within a week. He was a student in Bible College at the time of this incident, so we might surmise that he had already "decided to take Christian theism as true," in order to see where that led. If fideists are led into the kind of truth that Barry reported, such experiences have more than subjective value for Christian theism, although arguably not of the omniGod whom Bishop mentions. Experiences that penetrate the space-time-causal world also have the capacity, seemingly, to put comparable experiences that have no "objective" features into a different light -- perhaps they also are ones in which "beings belonging to another order" are encountered?

Post-biblical (including contemporary) Christic apparitions are important in the advocacy of uniquely Christian theism (as opposed to general theism), in my opinion, for the New Testament texts that describe the alleged post-Resurrection appearances of Jesus are so fraught with interpretive difficulties that one hardly knows what to make of them as evidence. Moreover, the Resurrection is presented as an event that no one witnessed, and the reported failure to find the corpse of Jesus offers only weakly supporting evidence for his Resurrection. Evangelicals often know something about these difficulties, and, unknowing or uncaring about possible additional evidence, advance Evangelical Christianity as something one should "believe by faith" -- perhaps to Bishop's chagrin, Christian theism, unlike general theism, is marked by historical (hence empirical) claims, so advancing it as a position that one might "believe by faith" seems irresponsible about empirical evidence. Claims about "the omniGod," on the other hand, are seemingly devoid of explicit empirical support, inasmuch as finite evidence cannot favor a being with infinite properties over one with very great but finite ones. Perhaps this is where "believing by faith," as Bishop describes it, is at its best.

What Bishop has done, in my opinion, is to rescue fideism from its irresponsible advocates, and to sketch the open, tolerant, and accepting stance that is found in those who are in pursuit of truth -- whether they are believers, agnostics or atheists. "Believing by faith" also appears to precede events that tip the balance toward theism, but this empirical claim needs more testing. I would like to think that Bishop would join me in calling for more studies about a possible causal relationship between his welcome kind of fideism and corroborating events, including religious experience. (Small errata in the book appear on pp. 77, 91, and 165.)