Bergson and Phenomenology

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Michael R. Kelly (ed.), Bergson and Phenomenology, Palgrave Macmillan, 2010, 277pp., $85.00, ISBN 9780230202382.

Reviewed by Alexandre Lefebvre, The University of Sydney


A special kind of unhappiness marks Henri Bergson's relationship to phenomenology: that of being dismissed by a tradition that has largely absorbed him. This is, at least, how Merleau-Ponty put it in late in his career:

If we had been careful readers of Bergson, and if more thought had been given to him, we would have been drawn to a much more concrete philosophy… . It is quite certain that Bergson, had we read him carefully, would have taught us things that ten or fifteen years later we believed to be discoveries made by the philosophy of existence itself.[1]

Thus, to show the contemporary relevance of Bergson for phenomenology, a different strategy is required than, say, rehabilitation (which would be necessary in analytical philosophy) or introduction (which would be the case in political philosophy). Instead, dialogue is called for to stage an encounter which has, in a sense, continually taken place and been consistently avoided. The virtue of Michael R. Kelly's volume is not only to have reconstructed debates between Bergson and classical phenomenologists but, more importantly, to propose a Bergsonian contribution to such central phenomenological topics as subjectivity, time, embodiment, nothingness, life, and freedom.[2]

The volume is divided into three parts. Part I, "Reading Bergson Anew: a Foundation for the Bergson/Phenomenology Debate," addresses Bergson on his own terms and prepares the dialogue between Bergson and phenomenology. Several articles are of note. Leonard Lawlor's essay convincingly shows how Bergson's method of intuition is able to transcend pragmatic everyday experience, all the while remaining within a strictly immanent framework. Gary Gutting reframes the history of twentieth-century French philosophy by placing Bergson at its head due to his effort to specify the concreteness that eludes the natural sciences. And Stephen Crocker's essay, "Man Falls Down," is an impressive reading of Bergson's Laughter as a treatise on the phenomenology of human finitude: our schemas of experience are never so revealed as when they fail.

Part II, "Intersections: the Bergson/Phenomenology Debate," turns to specific points of contact between Bergson and phenomenology. Here, the volume charts different directions with respect to French and German phenomenological traditions, given that the French are steeped in Bergson whereas the principal German phenomenologists the volume treats either ignore (Husserl) or dismiss (Heidegger) him. Part II thus opens with two essays which attempt to connect Bergson to German phenomenology. Hanne Jacobs and Trevor Perri's fine contribution links Husserlian reduction and Bergsonian intuition through their shared ambition of "learn[ing] to see differently," and Dan Zahavi's article assesses the merits of Bergson's account of time consciousness in Essai sur les données immédiates de la conscience in the context of the debate between Heidegger and Paul Natrop on self-consciousness. From there, the volume moves to consider the French tradition, with essays on Sartre (by Pete A.Y. Gunter), Merleau-Ponty (by Alia Al-Saji), Levinas (by Nicolas de Warren), and Michel Henry (by John Mullarkey).

Two of these essays especially stand out. Extending the theme of "seeing differently" from Jacobs and Perri, Al-Saji examines Bergson's appeal to see "sub specie durationis" as a kind of reduction that turns vision away from habit and utility toward a properly philosophical mode of seeing. De Warren, the only contributor to concentrate on Bergson's late great work The Two Sources of Morality and Religion, expands Levinas' astonishing remark that it is to Bergson "that I owe my modest speculative initiatives."[3] Indeed, de Warren's essay -- which both clarifies Levinas' relationship to Bergson and advances an original reading of Two Sources through the concept of the Levinasian Other -- exemplifies a selling point of the volume as a whole: simply put, it is refreshing to be presented with a Bergson made unfamiliar through his phenomenological motifs. One way to put this is that Bergson and Phenomenology helps to untuck Bergson from Deleuze's powerful, systematic, and resolutely anti-phenomenological interpretation that has especially marked English language scholarship (my own included). Or, better said, a strength of the volume lies in a reconsideration of Bergson's phenomenology in light of Deleuze's emphasis on time, creativity, and impersonality. It is perhaps in this sense that we are to understand Kelly's claim that Bergson's concepts "now appear relevant for issues in contemporary research in phenomenology -- even if [they] are not 'phenomenological,' and perhaps most importantly precisely because they are not" (2).

Part III, "Life-World and Life: the Fundament of the Bergson/Phenomenology Debate," concludes the volume with three essays from prominent French interpreters: Pierre Kerszberg, Frédéric Worms, and Renaud Barbaras. The tone of Part III is slightly different in that the authors argue in favor of either Bergson or phenomenology. On the one hand, Worms proposes that Bergson helpfully displaces the opposition in phenomenology between consciousness and life, whereas, on the other hand, Barbaras argues that Bergson remains caught in a dualism between matter and memory that stifles an authentic phenomenology of life. Though critical, none of these pieces are polemical, and each maintains Bergson's ethical and methodological injunction to clarify problems before siding with positions.

Bergson and Phenomenology is an excellent volume that opens new perspectives on both of its subjects. It is a grounded yet wide-ranging collection that spans Bergson's writings and most major classical phenomenologists. My one disappointment is that it paid little attention to Bergson's Two Sources, which contains several phenomenological themes that could be developed with profit. For example, its examination of mystical love could be treated in light of Jean-Luc Marion's The Erotic Phenomenon, its discussion of creative temporality compared to Derrida's messianism, and its analysis of sociability connected with Alfred Schütz's Phenomenology of the Social World. But, of course, this is less a criticism of the present volume than an indication of work ahead.

[1] Cited in Kelly's introduction to Bergson and Phenomenology, 18. See Merleau-Ponty, "The Philosophy of Existence," in Texts and Dialogues, ed. H. Silverman and J. Barry, Jr., M. Smith, et al., Humanities Press, 1992, 132.

[2] The only other volume dedicated to Bergson and phenomenology is Frédéric Worms (ed.), Annales bergsoniennes II: Bergson, Deleuze, la phénoménologie, Presses Universitaires de France, 2004.

[3] Cited in Bergson and Phenomenology, 177. See Levinas, Entre Nous, trans. M. Smith and B. Harshav, Columbia University Press, 1998, 197.