Bergson, Complexity and Creative Emergence

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David Kreps, Bergson, Complexity and Creative Emergence, Palgrave Macmillan, 2015, 238pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137412195.

Reviewed by John Protevi, Louisiana State University


This book yields mixed results. It is admirably bold and ambitious, but two omissions detract from its accomplishments: it omits many conceptual distinctions expected by philosophers and it omits areas of ongoing philosophical and scientific research pertinent to its claims. While perhaps part of those omissions can be chalked up to the goals of the author ("both to inform those aware of philosophy concerning the developments in environmental biology; and, perhaps more importantly, vice versa," p. 1)[1], their cumulative impact nonetheless limits the benefits for philosophers.

The book's strength are concentrated in the second, fourth, and fifth of its six total chapters. Chapter 1 provides a quick overview. Chapter 2 traces Bergson's core ideas; this is a useful survey for those new to Bergson. Chapter 3 is a disappointing attempt to put Bergson in the context of "poststructuralism," but Chapter 4 provides a useful history of systems theory, culminating in von Bertalanffy. Chapter 5 is where the book's ultimate worth is put to the test; it treats Bergson's thought in relation to the process structuralism biology of Stuart Kauffman and Brian Goodwin (who in books from the mid-1990s used "complexity theory" or nonlinear dynamic systems modeling in their discussions of morphogenesis and evolution). While I will have critical remarks to make about this chapter, its main lines -- though, again, not its sentence-level detail -- are not without interest. Chapter 6 begins with a peroration that urges on the reader Bergson's openness of spirit and mind and ends with the author's speculations on the future; reading this will no doubt provoke a range of reactions, depending on one's tolerance for those genres.

Chapter 2 treats four concepts of Bergson relevant to the ultimate goal of exploring the relation of Bergson's thought to that of the complexity biologists Kauffman and Goodwin: philosophical intuition; durée réelle and the associated distinctions of discrete and continuous multiplicity and difference of degree / difference of kind (from Time and Free Will); the memory-perception pair and Bergson's "deconstruction"[2] of the realism / idealism opposition (from Matter and Memory); and élan vital (from Creative Evolution).

The exposition here is solid, informative, and trustworthy, thus fitting the needs of the scientific part of the intended readership for a tour of Bergson. However, the notes reveal some outdated and under-contextualized resources, which hurt the utility of the chapter for following up on the leads inherent in Bergson's work.

For instance, Benjamin Libet's work is mentioned, but no contextualization in the form of criticisms of ecological validity of his work, that is, the relevance of his work for analysis of everyday life. There's also no mention of the sensorimotor account of perception launched by Alva Noë and Kevin O'Regan in 1999 and subsequently developed by Noë in Action in Perception (2005); this is clearly relevant to Kreps's treatment of Bergson's doctrine of pragmatically oriented perception. Similarly, Alicia Juarrero's 1999 book deserves mention in any discussion of epiphenomenalism. Also missing is an account of the main lines of work on "the hard problem," as well as critique of setting up the problem in that way (e.g., Thompson 2007). And, although no review of the literature or even list of references can be complete, Paola Marrati 2010 is missing despite being directly on the topic of Bergson and evolution.

All that being said, the concluding section of Chapter 2, treating élan vital in Creative Evolution, is clear, concise, and engaging. Kreps carefully explains Bergson's critiques of mechanism and finalism in evolution and well prepares the way for the later discussions of Bergson's panpsychism in Chapters 5 and 6.

I found Chapter 3 disappointing for two main reasons: its scant (three-page) treatment of Deleuze and its very abstract notion of "poststructuralism."  Kreps's treatment of Deleuze deals only with the latter's discussion of Bergson's intuition as philosophical method. This is inadequate, for in the present context Deleuze is clearly the most important of the poststructuralists for the simple reason that he is the only one to have devoted a book to Bergson, thus precipitating the rediscovery of Bergson. The sole focus on Deleuze's discussion of intuition means a neglect of the distinction between virtual and actual. This neglect results in Kreps using "possibility" throughout in ontological discussions, when one of the most important of all of Deleuze's points in discussing Bergson (and one he retained in his own work) is that the actualization of the virtual is not equivalent to the realization of the possible. The possible is, as Deleuze explains, for Bergson a more complex idea than the real; the possible is the real with existence subtracted and then projected into a realm in which it awaits the addition of existence. But this scheme makes the possible into the ghostly image of the real; the possible thing is formed, is an identity, whereas the virtual is not formed so that actualization is a formation, a bringing into identity. Hence the term "potential" should be used for the virtual, not possible.

The second big problem with Chapter 3 is its organizing rubric of "postructuralism." First it should be noted that Kreps gets the term "poststructuralist turn" not from any of the philosophers in question, but from a secondary source (Douglass 1992; from the subtitle of which Kreps also draws the title of the chapter 3, "Bergson Redux").[3] After his brief treatment of Deleuze, Kreps goes on to very, very rapidly discuss Saussure, Althusser, Nietzsche, Derrida, Foucault, and Butler before turning back to Deleuze for a single summarizing paragraph. Collecting all these thinkers together is only possible by an extremely abstract use of "poststructuralism" implying a liking for mobility, difference, and multiplicity. For instance, p. 9: "Both Derrida and Foucault, in the same period [as that of Deleuze's book on Bergson], similarly adopted very Bergsonian positions on key questions, although neither really credited him." But -- leaving to one side the plausibility of attributing "very Bergsonian positions" to Derrida and Foucault -- Deleuze didn't really "adopt" "Bergsonian positions" so much as take up and use for his own purposes the notions of virtuality and multiplicity he excavated from Bergson, combining them with Spinoza, Maimon, Nietzsche, and Simondon (among others). And to bring Derrida and Foucault together, let alone to bring them together under a Bergsonian aegis, is to operate at an extremely high level of abstraction. At a certain level of abstraction all four thinkers adhere to the "poststructuralist" notion of a differential field on the basis of which individuation occurs, but the different emphases, interests, methods, and ontological domains in which they operate make the sort of gathering together under the rubric of "poststructuralism" of little use in precise philosophical work.

Chapter 4 bills itself as a "somewhat Foucauldian genealogical interpretation of the concept of 'system'" (p. 110), but does not distinguish archaeology from genealogy, and its genealogy does little more than mention the World War II context for cybernetics without really exploring the relation of discursive and non-discursive practices characteristic of Foucault's genealogies. It also portrays non-linear dynamics or chaos / complexity theory as a more "mature" form of systems theory, but "maturation" is not a genealogical or archaeological concept (p. 111). All that notwithstanding, a charitable reading should allow Kreps the opportunity to graft Foucault's thresholds of positivity, epistemologization, scientificity, and formalization from Archaeology of Knowledge to Stephen Pepper's (1970) notions of the four root metaphors of "formism," mechanism, contextualism, and organicism; the result is a bit of a Frankenstein's monster but once the narrative is up and running the story it tells held my interest and provided quite a few excellent references for follow up work (though the work of Steven Heims [e.g., Heims 1993] was surprisingly missing from the works cited). The main theme is the orientation to equilibrium of cybernetics and systems theory coming to be replaced by the "edge of chaos" orientation of Kauffman's later work, and this narrative is a useful framing device for Chapter 5, the do-or-die chapter of the book.

Chapter 5 has some conceptual problems; I will provide a list of them before dealing with its main thesis. Before that I should make it clear that the main lines of Kreps's treatment of Prigogine and Stengers 1985 (the main resource for Kreps) are well articulated; the problems below are more than terminological, but less than conceptually fatal.

First, the chapter doesn't distinguish chaos -- simple dynamical laws giving rise to complex behavior (Lorenz-style sensitivity to initial conditions) -- from complexity or collapse of chaos (Kauffman-style self-organization resulting in downward causation, that is, achievement of simplicity of behavior). Similarly, Kreps uses the term "indetermination" without discussion of the way in which many chaos / complexity scientists (e.g., Lorenz) insist that nonlinear dynamic systems remain deterministic, though unpredictable to humans due to their extreme sensitivity to initial conditions exceeding our measuring power. Others allow for complex self-organization to produce strong, ontological, emergence, as we will discuss below, but Kreps does not indicate the outlines of the dispute -- he simply presents the position in which indetermination implies strong emergence.

Second, Kreps neglects to distinguish methodological individualism from ontological individualism in the discussion of emergence (p. 186). That is, methodological individualism is compatible with the admission of emergent properties, once the attempt to account for systemic properties as aggregates has been made without success. Ontological individualism, on the other hand, denies ontological emergence and thus limits emergence claims to the epistemic realm, so that properties irreducible to aggregates merely reflect human limitations. Furthermore, the book fails to distinguish emergence as synchronic ("whole is more than the sum of its parts") from the diachronic emergence of novelty. The simple term "emergence" is used for both terms. Thus, most seriously, it simply assumes strong or ontological emergence, without real investigation of the arguments against that position. It might very well be that this is the only position that resonates with Bergson, but that should be admitted openly, so that the hypothetical nature of the argument -- if we accept strong emergence, both synchronic and diachronic, then we find resonance with Bergson -- is made clear. (For an overview of emergence issues, a well-cited piece is Silberstein and McGeever 1999.)

Third, Kreps doesn't articulate the notion of "consciousness" in Bergson with the well-known problems discussed in the panpsychism literature (ably covered in Skrbina 2005). For instance, two of the most prominent are the problem of aggregates (is the table conscious or just its components?) and the problem of distinguishing qualities of consciousness (shouldn't we have a differentiated vocabulary stretching from full-blown self-consciousness down to the "glimmers" we might attribute to micro-elements?). It's not that Kreps doesn't emphasize Bergson's claim of human exceptionality (p. 223); it's just that a more articulated vocabulary would help the discussion of the differences between elemental and human consciousness.

Finally, perhaps a small note, but the book also neglects to distinguish organizational closure or autonomy from thermodynamic openness in the discussion of autopoiesis (p. 180).[4]

A further problem is that the book is not up-to-date even with popular treatments of contemporary biological research. Goodwin's (1994) and Kauffman's (1995) books from the mid-90s are by far the go-to sources. This misses newer work on contemporary biology that is of prima facie interest to a new scientific Bergsonism such as epigenetics (Jablonka and Lamb 2004), co-evolution and niche theory (usefully recapped in Pigliucci and Müller 2010), developmental plasticity (West-Eberhard 2003), developmental systems theory (Oyama, Griffiths, and Gray 2003), and enactivism (Thompson 2007), as well as new research on the origin of life (though there is a brief mention of England 2013).

Those problems to one side, the book's key point arrives in Chapter 5 (after a longish treatment of Bergson and physics): the claim is that Bergson's notions of duration and élan vital resonate with and provide interesting metaphysical speculations complementing a process structuralist biology of the Goodwin and Kauffman stripe. This is certainly provocative and worth further thought. The key claim is that the openness and unpredictability of systems "at the edge of chaos" (where a system can be said to "choose" at bifurcation points in its state space) meets the Bergsonian desideratum of an open universe that takes irreversible time and evolutionary difference seriously. In particular, Kreps stresses the way Bergson's insistence on the differentiating force of élan vital (which Kreps successfully defends from the charge of a substantialist vitalism along the lines of Hans Dreisch) puts him in line with those who see natural selection as a secondary pruning of a primary differentiation.

To sum up, then, the book has its rewarding points -- in particular the overview of Bergson's thought in Chapter 2 and the history of systems theory offered in Chapter 4 -- but reading it also brings frustrations at its lack of conceptual refinement and its somewhat antiquated references.


Douglas, Paul (1992). Deleuze's Bergson: Bergson redux. In Burwick, Frederick and Douglass, Paul (1992). The Crisis in Modernism: Bergson and the Vitalist Controversy.

England, Jeremy (2013). Statistical physics of self-replication. Journal of Chemical Physics 139, 121923.

Goodwin, Brian (1994). How the Leopard Changed its Spots. Scribner.

Heims, Steven (1993). Constructing a Social Science for Postwar America: The Cybernetics Group, 1946-1953. MIT Press.

Jablonka, Eva and Lamb, Marion (2004). Evolution in Four Dimensions. MIT Press.

Juarrero, Alicia (1999). Dynamics in Action: Intentional Behavior as a Complex System. MIT Press.

Kauffman, Stuart (1995). At Home in the Universe. Oxford University Press.

Lorenz, Edward (1972). Predictability: Does the Flap of a Butterfly's Wing in Brazil Set Off a Tornado in Texas? (Presentation to the American Association for the Advancement of Science). 

Marrati, Paola (2010). The Natural Cyborg: The stakes of Bergson's philosophy of evolution. Southern Journal of Philosophy 48, supplement s1: 3-17.

Noë, Alva (2005). Action in Perception. MIT Press.

O'Regan, J. Kevin and Noë, Alva (2001). A sensorimotor account of vision and visual consciousness. Behavioral and Brain Sciences 24 (5): 883-917.

Oyama, Susan; Griffiths, Paul; and Gray, Russell (2003). Cycles of Contingency: Developmental Systems and Evolution. MIT Press.

Pepper, Steven (1970 [1942]). World Hypotheses: A study of evidence. University of California Press.

Pigliucci, Massimo and Müller, Gerd (2010). Evolution, the Extended Synthesis. MIT Press.

Prigogine, Ilya and Stengers, Isabelle (1985). Order out of Chaos. Fontana.

Silberstein, Michael and McGeever, John (1999). The Search for Ontological Emergence. The Philosophical Quarterly. Vol. 49, No. 195 (Apr., 1999), pp. 182-200.

Skrbina, David (2005). Panpsychism in the West. MIT Press.

Thompson, Evan (2007). Mind in Life: Biology, Phenomenology, and the Sciences of Mind. Harvard University Press.

West-Eberhard, Mary Jane (2003). Developmental Plasticity and Evolution. Oxford University Press.

[1] The awkwardness of this formulation, which is enough to require a second reading, is not an isolated occurrence. (It would have been better rendered as "both to inform philosophers of developments in environmental biology and to inform scientists of Bergson's philosophy.") There are also quite a number of copy-editing errors that similarly distract from a smooth reading; the most disruptive of these are the repeated use of "Smithsonian" as the adjectival form of "Smith" (instead of "Smithian") and the (single) appearance (p. 3) of the at best antiquated term "Jewess" in referring to Bergson's mother (instead of "Jewish woman").

[2] Kreps retrospectively uses the Derridean term to describe Bergson's work when the latter follows a schema of 1) reversal of dominance in conceptual pairs, 2) demonstration of the necessity of the denigrated term to the privileged term, 3) revelation of a common misunderstanding allowing the opposition, and 4) revelation of a blurring or blending of borders between the two original terms. This is certainly in the ballpark of "deconstruction," though a classic Derridean schema would culminate in the creation of a conceptual field named by the denigrated term (e.g., "arche-writing").

[3] The endnote (p. 107, n. 25) unfortunately only refers to the edited collection (Burwick and Douglass 1992), not to the specific chapter in which the phrase occurs.

[4] The attribution of the term "autopoiesis" to Humberto Maturana alone, without reference to Francisco Varela, is an error that should not have been made and/or should have been corrected.