Bergson, Politics, and Religion

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Alexandre Lefebvre and Melanie White (eds.), Bergson, Politics, and Religion, Duke University Press, 2012, 352pp., $25.95 (pbk), 9780822352754.

Reviewed by Keith Robinson, University of Arkansas, Little Rock


A considerable amount of work has been done in the last twenty years or so to revive the philosophical fortunes of Henri Bergson.  But much of that work has concentrated on his philosophy of life, time and creativity and how this casts traditional problems in metaphysics and epistemology in a new light or helps to rethink specific issues in philosophy of science, particularly contemporary biology and evolutionary theory. Little work has focused on his political thought and its relation to religion, and the editors can rightly claim in their introduction to this collection of essays "that this is the first volume in English dedicated to the political and religious aspects of his thought" (1). The editors ground this focus on the political and the religious by bringing together papers that attempt to clarify and develop the problems that concerned Bergson in his final book, The Two Sources of Religion and Morality, showing how they are still relevant and challenging today. In addition, and just as important, is the effort to extend Bergson's thought in new directions. Indeed, the central innovation of this collection is to argue that Bergson has much to contribute to our current thinking because his thought can be re-actualized along different lines through the creation of new problems, particularly problems that connect the political and the religious in novel ways.

The book includes fifteen articles and an introduction, and is divided into three sections. The first is devoted to "The Closed and the Open", the second to "Politics" and the third to "Religion and Mysticism". The editors' introduction contextualizes the importance of Bergson's contribution to thinking the political and offers some reasons why he has been neglected in the English speaking world. One key reason is that, although Bergson does not ignore the traditional problems of political philosophy -- the limits and justification of state power, the principles of a just society, the reconciliation of liberty and equality, etc. -- he approaches them obliquely, displacing them onto a deeper, underlying problem or simply reconfiguring them altogether. The papers in this section illustrate this as each attempts to come to terms with the governing dualism of Bergson's Two Sources.

The open and the closed are the 'two sources' of religion and morality and the basic tendencies of life. In Creative Evolution Bergson had analyzed these tendencies in relation to a metaphysics of duration. In the Two Sources they function as a set of contrasts that structure social, religious and political life: on the one hand a tendency toward stasis, boundedness, stability and closure; on the other hand a tendency toward open-ended change, novelty and newness. In his contribution Frédéric Worms argues that the distinction between the open and closed "could change everything" (25) because it effectively exists in history and life. Worms argues that Bergson has perhaps two central goals in the Two Sources. First, he aims to show that the open and the closed are forces or tendencies of life operative in moralities, religions and all forms of social and political organization. Second, he wants to make this distinction available for practical use in the face of the dangers of mechanization and war. For Worms Two Sources culminates in a politics of the 'in-between', a constantly renewed effort to renegotiate the two opposed directions or tendencies.

John Mullarkey's paper, "Equally Circular: Bergson and the Vague Inventions of Politics," takes up something like the politics of the in-between and argues that, for Bergson, equality will not come about through pushing back boundary lines between self and other, as though the movement toward equality required a steady, definite and continuous passage from the closed to the open. This would reduce one source or tendency to another and set up an intractable, viciously circular problem. Rather, the open is itself the vague process through which the conditions for new forms of equality, perhaps as yet unrealisable and even unthought, are felt and created. This creative emotion opens a new kind of thinking that is neither finite or infinite but 'indefinite', and so the movement of equality is always reinventing itself.

For Suzanne Guerlac, in "Bergson, the Void, and the Politics of Life", this indefinite movement would place Bergson closer in some respects to Bruno Latour and Gabriel Tarde as essentially 'nonmodern'. From this nonmodern perspective the oppositions of subject and object, nature and culture, and human and non-human are disrupted and displaced. One cannot achieve the great ideals of modern politics (i.e., equality, liberty, fraternity) by simply pushing emancipation further out. Such discourses of extension circulate within the egotistical, rationally self-interested and anthropocentric enclosures of the closed society. As Bergson argues, there is a difference in kind, not just degree, between the closed and the open, requiring a kind of affective leap or a 'love without preference' that only a few rare souls appear capable of.

Guerlac compares Bergson and Jacques Derrida on this point, claiming that Bergson is only interested in the action of love since for him 'mystical' love has no object whereas Derrida concentrates on the intersubjective object of love. This may be, but it is much more difficult to productively disentangle their thought in a text like Derrida's Faith and Knowledge, which explicitly references Bergson (and Kant) in its subtitle ("The Two Sources of Religion at the Limits of Reason Alone") and at crucial points in the text. Guerlac's is the only essay to mention Derrida, and I would like to have seen a more sustained engagement with him in this volume. Derrida's concepts of 'autoimmunity', 'mechanicity', 'democracy to come', 'the messianic', 'unconditional justice' and such would be ideal conceptual interlocutors for thinking about the contemporaneity of Bergson's work on politics and religion.

Much of the second section concerns the affective constitution of the political and how it might be approached. Philippe Soulez's chapter "Bergson as Philosopher of War and Theorist of the Political" shows that the particular problem that underlies the 'two sources' or two tendencies for Bergson is the instinct for war. Therefore, an understanding of the affective political forces at work in generating the conditions for war may aid in thwarting or abating its worst effects. Here Bergson raises a question: if we presuppose a progressive expansion of moral duties from family to nation and on to humanity, then how is war possible? One central view is that it is a regrettable exception, a temporary cessation of human rights and our primary moral obligations. As Bergson says, in war "fair is foul and foul is fair". But this is unsatisfactory if we accept that we do have obligations and duties to all. Bergson's solution here is to turn things around: war is not an exception but a natural instinct and the protection and security of society is an evolutionary response to this instinct.

Several papers in this section address this problem by looking at Bergson's work on human rights, although he wrote only a few pages on this topic. Carl Power's "Bergson's Critique of Practical Reason" compares him with Badiou on this point in order to highlight Bergson's commitment to a conception of universal human rights that could "extend the poststructuralist project" (187). For Badiou human rights are thinly veiled abstractions mired in hypocrisy and nihilism. They are grounded in an understanding of the human or 'Man' that is reducible to the biological, an animal capable of suffering ('a featherless biped whose charms are not obvious') and whose life must be preserved by right. Moreover, human rights advance no positive vision of the good but merely negate a set of evils that everyone recognizes a priori. Against this view Bergson posits human rights as 'absolute', independent of any socio-political framework, historical actualization or species concept. Such an absolute is positively charged with the affirmation of all humanity. If Badiou thinks of human rights as essentially 'closed', Bergson gives us instances -- from Christian love to the declaration of the 'Rights of Man' -- of this 'opening' of the absolute onto history.

In "Bergson and Human Rights" Alexander Lefebvre elaborates on these claims and argues that human rights are "the organizing center" (194) of Bergson's political philosophy, serving as both a positive vision of the good and as a normative device for evaluating political phenomena of all kinds. Human rights serve a double function: to protect and to convert. For Lefebvre's Bergson human rights "protect us from hate and convert us to love" (196). In this sense human rights have both open and closed tendencies (and so Badiou's mistake is to only think of human rights from the point of view of the closed society). The open tendency is a movement of the absolute, of love without preference. The closed tendency is the effort to protect -- through declarations, conventions, laws, criminal courts and even military intervention -- against the most dangerous aspects of the closed society. In this the closed function is turned against itself and limited to a certain sphere of activity, while the open tendency is actualized in the form of an aspirational love that guides and directs the institutions and agencies of human rights. Human rights are the mechanism for the reciprocal processes of translation and conversion between these tendencies.

These processes are 'religious' in Bergson's sense: the dynamic insights of the great mystics are codified and translated into the doctrines that are stabilized by society. In the final section papers are given over to a consideration of 'Religion and Mysticism'. In their contribution Keith Ansell Pearson and Jim Urpeth compare "Bergson and Nietzsche on Religion". If for Nietzsche religion has its roots in fear, for Bergson, the authors argue, static religion is a reaction against fear or, more precisely, a defensive reaction on the part of nature toward the recognition by intelligence of the inevitability of death. Static religion attaches individuals to life and society through 'fabulation', a story-telling and myth-making function that gives individuals purpose and meaning, a confidence in life that protects against the ratiocination of the intellect. This confidence in life is transfigured in dynamic religion by the great mystics who draw upon the creative forces of existence. Is there something like dynamic religion in Nietzsche? The authors argue that there is and that both Bergson and Nietzsche can be thought of as thinkers of natural religion who, drawing on different sources, identify their key concepts ('will to power', élan vital) with the movement of the divine.

As we've seen, some papers in this collection borrow from Bergson a critique of what we might call the 'extensional fallacy': the idea that a too narrowly defined rationality or feeling can progressively push forward an extension of moral obligation from the individual to all of humanity and beyond. For Bergson this is the result of fallacious a priori reasoning based on an 'intellectualist' conception of the soul. Only an expanded or more capacious experience -- 'supra-intellectual' and 'mystical' -- could truly approach the universal, and for Bergson it would be a universal empty of any a priori content. In other words for the 'open soul' anything and everything can in principle be loved, and this cannot be determined a priori. That anything can potentially take on moral value, and that this possibility is kept permanently open, are amongst the key characteristics of mystical life.

Several papers attempt to think through the political-ethical value of this universal love in what is variously called the 'in-between' (Worms), the 'indefinite' (Mullarkey), the 'aesthetic' (Colebrook), an 'unjust charity' (Lawlor), 'mobilism' (Jankélévitch) and 'human rights' (Lefebvre). The critique of the extensional fallacy and an ethics of the open universal could serve as points of entry for Bergson into debates on ethics and politics in both continental and analytic traditions. Many philosophers have attempted to think about the questions raised here, and perhaps this collection could have brought Bergson into dialogue with more of them. I have already mentioned Derrida. A case could be made for others, although it might be churlish to do so. As it stands this is already a fine volume of rich, varied and interesting material that in general could be seen as a contribution to the 'affective turn' in the humanities and as an intervention in poststructuralist debates on politics and religion. The introduction by the editors is excellent and the essays are of a uniformly high quality, with several taking 'Bergsonian' thought into new territory. Both Bergson scholars and those new to his work will find much here that will stimulate thinking. What this collection makes clear is that the 'return' to Bergson remains in its infancy in several respects. Bergson's texts are still before us and continue to speak to us in novel ways. This volume certainly initiates a broad set of discussions on The Two Sources of Religion and Morality, elevating its status and its relation to Bergson's oeuvre as whole. In addition, this collection demonstrates that Bergson's thought can be re-actualized across a wide range of problems and contexts barely touched on by the texts. In this sense Bergson's legacy is still to come.