Bergson: Thinking Beyond the Human Condition

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Keith Ansell-Pearson, Bergson: Thinking Beyond the Human Condition, Bloomsbury, 2018, 194 pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781350043954

Reviewed by Donald A. Landes, Université Laval


In his introduction to the remarkable new Quadrige/PUF collection of critical editions of Henri Bergson's works in French, Frédéric Worms rightly suggests that, like all philosophical classics, Bergson's oeuvre deserves to be both read with fresh eyes, as if it has just appeared, and studied with the help of scholarly tools equal to its importance and influence.[1] By offering a lively reading of Bergson's texts and providing scholarly explorations of connections, influences, comparisons, and potential further contributions, Keith Ansell-Pearson fulfills both of these goals. The volume is the result of two decades of his research and teaching, gathering together his essays and chapters on various aspects of Bergson's thought, with one new chapter written especially for this volume. Despite their diverse provenance, these chapters share several strong themes that tie them together, notably the recurrence of Ansell-Pearson's key insight that we must see in Bergson a "thinking beyond the human condition." Although the nature of a collected volume necessarily leaves some topics or connections unthematized, and often leaves aside some important aspects of the topic at hand, Ansell-Pearson's book is unquestionably a remarkable introduction to a large swath of Bergson's work and an invaluable contribution to the ongoing resurgence of interest in Bergson.

Henri Bergson occupies an intriguing place in the history of philosophy. Despite being the most famous philosopher during his lifetime and possessing a lucid and engaging style of philosophical reflection, his importance has nonetheless waxed and waned with the times. Perhaps this is not surprising, given that Bergson's philosophy requires a constant attempt to resist dogmatic or static thinking in the face of the inevitability of this tendency. Nevertheless, not only have many of his concepts sedimented into our collective philosophical lexicon, but Bergson has also had a marked influence on specific thinkers (such as Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze) and on developments outside of philosophy. Following Gary Gutting's description, Ansell-Pearson suggests that Bergson's enduring greatness perhaps lies in his unique "combination of descriptive concreteness and systematic scope and metaphysical ambition" (1). His philosophy is a call to a going beyond of philosophy and the human condition, since traditional approaches to the problems of philosophy "presuppose a subject already installed in being" and thus already located within the confines of the human condition (ibid.).

By always beginning his reflection from what he names durée (duration), Bergson elevates change or becoming to the status of the absolute, to the very fabric (étoffe) of reality itself. For Bergson, philosophy's goal (or its promise) is to somehow allow us to "dissolve again into the Whole" from which our intelligence and subjectivity have crystallized, without thereby merely losing ourselves in the wash of being.[2] His "thinking beyond the human condition" is more than just the intellectual recognition of the limitations of human intelligence; it invites the reader to a conversion to a new way of seeing the world, and to a manner of living in that world differently. Bergson's philosophy is thus more like the various philosophical schools of Ancient Greece. Indeed, one of Ansell-Pearson's most important contributions in this book, which comes to fruition in the final chapter, is how he connects Bergson's philosophy to the work of Pierre Hadot and the notion of philosophy as a way of life.

Ansell-Pearson's theme of "beyond the human condition" stems from his laudable gesture of locating Bergson's Creative Evolution (1907) at the centre of his philosophy. For Ansell-Pearson, the philosophy of life is fundamental to Bergson's thinking (4). The fact that human intelligence emerges within the overall trajectory of life is an essential point in Bergson's worldview and shapes many of his arguments. Human intelligence aims at action, utility, and more generally our insertion into the material world. It is thus woefully inadequate for philosophical speculation -- an activity it nonetheless boldly pursues. But this emphasis on the philosophy of life also allows Ansell-Pearson to draw out two kinds of "joy" that return throughout Bergson's work. First, working beyond the usual confines of the human intellect provides us a certain joy in "seeing the world come into being as if for the first time" (4), that is, a sort of phenomenological wonder standing before the direct experience of becoming. Second, it allows for a sort of "joy to be had from cultivating a superior human nature and through engaging in the creation of the self by the self" (5). In other words, Ansell-Pearson identifies a joy of immanence that we experience by dissolving into the Whole and a joy of transcendence in our taking up the creative movement of life and our own lived self-creation.

The above demonstrates the lively and fresh character of Ansell-Pearson's reading of Bergson. The first chapter, "An Introduction to Bergson," makes significant inroads into that second value that Worms mentions, namely providing scholarly tools equal to the importance of this thinker. Written by one of the most informed and careful Anglophone readers of Bergson, this introductory chapter should find its way onto any list of recommended readings for students studying Bergson. The chapter provides a careful reconstruction of Bergson's key ideas and responds to some of the difficulties in approaching his thought today. For instance, as Ansell-Pearson notes, Bergson's philosophy maintains a rather nuanced engagement with science, yet is neither a philosophical naturalism nor a philosophy of science. Bergson "seeks to demonstrate the absolute through placing man back into nature and the evolution of life. That is, he uses the resources of naturalism and empiricism to support an apparently Idealist philosophical programme" (10). Bergson's "true" empiricism and its complex relation to science, however, leaves him somewhat homeless in terms of the contemporary divisions of academic philosophy between a continental suspicion of naturalism and an analytic tendency toward it.

But the most valuable aspect of Ansell-Pearson's introductory chapter is his coherent response to two criticisms often leveled at Bergson's work: (i) the claim that naturalism is incapable of accomplishing the very goal Bergson sets for himself, namely the identification of differences of nature rather than of degree; (ii) that Bergson's identification of the biological at the heart of his philosophy does not justify his application of his method to all levels of existence. Ansell-Pearson answers these two criticisms by clarifying Bergson's reaction to Kantian philosophy. Rather than assuming the existence and a priori structure of the intellect, Bergson sets out to follow the simultaneous genesis of mind and matter, progressively adapting to each other and stabilizing in the forms that shape our current (static) phase in this movement. Kant (or intellectualism more generally) adeptly explains what happens within a world already intellectualized, spatialized, and individuated, the world of repetition and causality. Yet for Bergson, reality includes freedom, true evolution, creation, and the invention of forms. The frames of knowledge are only a priori from a perspective within the current structures of the human condition. The illusion of the universal a priori is, for Bergson, a result of the natural tendency of the intellect; philosophy needs to become a sort of violence against this fascination with the spatialized and intellectualized world.

A particularly important contribution to Bergson scholarship is to be found in Ansell-Pearson's second chapter, "A Melancholy Science: Bergson on Lucretius." The chapter provides a fascinating reading of a relatively unknown text by Bergson, namely his 1884 commentary on Lucretius's great poem De Rerum Natura. Ansell-Pearson here identifies several themes that return in Bergson's more well-known works and demonstrates Bergson's sympathy for philosophy as a potential art of living. Moreover, this chapter shows how Bergson, often associated with the French spiritualist tradition, also expressed an early sympathy for a materialist philosophy, an atomism that nonetheless reserves a place for freedom and creation (via the clinamen). Nevertheless, Bergson ultimately finds in Lucretius an overly melancholic philosophy of nature (50), banishing the gods from nature and rejecting all superstition (52). This observation helps to frame Bergson's own response to the structure of nature and the human condition (including superstition) in his later book The Two Sources of Morality and Religion (1932).

Chapters 3 and 4 offer an engaging introduction to Bergson's first two major books, Time and Free Will (1889) and Matter and Memory (1896). Emphasizing the foundational role of the idea of duration (durée), Ansell-Pearson draws out the philosophical consequences of Bergson's rich though arguably underdeveloped notion of the self. Bergson rejects absolute freedom, focusing rather on our capacity to break from the habitual structures of our social existence so as to occasionally act authentically from our whole character (where character is conceived as a deep structure of evolving duration). For Bergson, duration is a primordial fact of experience, in no more need of justification than physical reality, though duration is consistently covered over by the spatializing tendencies of the intellect (56). Thus, the self is at once the superficial self of habits and the deep self of incessant self-creation and duration (see, in particular, pages 68-71). Turning his attention to Matter and Memory, Ansell-Pearson focuses on how duration implies the metaphysical assumption of a "co-existence of past and present" (74) and the idea that the preservation of the past is oriented toward the future. In other words, memory is not merely reproduction or repetition; it is intricately involved in "invention and creation" (74). In this chapter, the reader will find a good explanation of both pure memory and pure perception, as well as the famous distinction between habit-memory and memory proper. Ansell-Pearson does not, however, include a discussion of the image of the cone, an essential though often misunderstood moment in Bergson's argument. It seems to me that a discussion of this image could have reinforced Ansell-Pearson's theme of philosophy and the art of living, given Bergson's image of the well adapted person.[3] The final section of chapter 4 offers a valuable reflection on connections with post-structuralism, critical theory, philosophy of mind, and hermeneutics.

Turning to Bergson's third major book, Creative Evolution, Ansell-Pearson's fifth chapter focuses on the underlying aim of that book, namely a fundamental reformation of philosophy itself via the philosophy of life. Often overlooked in English scholarship, Creative Evolution is in some ways Bergson's most important book and is highly influential in the French reception of his thought. The book is particularly relevant as well to Ansell-Pearson's main theme, since it is Bergson's most extended attempt to expand human perception and thought beyond individual durational experience (the limits of the human condition). The chapter, however, does not fully exploit the resources in Creative Evolution. For instance, Ansell-Pearson could have drawn more explicitly upon themes such as the relationship between life and matter; the shared movement that Bergson names intelligibility and materiality; the role of interruption or inversion of a tension in his argument; the importance of the pseudo-idea arguments; the metaphysical definition of life as ascent and matter as descent; the claim that the universe itself endures, etc. These aspects would have strengthened Ansell-Pearson's claim as to the radical rethinking of philosophy that takes place in Creative Evolution. Rather, Ansell-Pearson focuses on another important aspect, namely the role of life and biology in Bergson's philosophy.

The final three chapters provide an extremely valuable set of contributions to Bergson scholarship. In Chapter 6, "Bergson and Ethics," Ansell-Pearson explores the ethical turn in Bergson's last book, The Two Sources of Morality and Religion. Rethinking the role of life in his ethics and the label of sociobiology, Ansell-Pearson succeeds in clarifying the biological and the phenomenological aspects of Bergson's ethics. The danger of misinterpreting the biological foundation looms up in an oft-quoted passage from Two Sources: "Let us then give to the word biology the very wide meaning it should have, and will perhaps have one day, and let us say in conclusion that all morality, be it of pressure or aspiration, is in essence biological" (cited, 125). Yet "Bergson's sociobiology is not conformist in that it does not seek to legitimize natural essences but rather aims at the continual creation of new social forms" (111). Such an ethics will not reduce or merely naturalize the forms of morality to biology, but rather naturalize the movement of morality, insisting at once on the creative processes of construction and the inherent immanence of the ethical within the open trajectories of creative evolution. As Ansell-Pearson points out, morality emerges from (but is not reduced to) biology via two sources: "the twin tendencies of life (preservation and enhancement or overcoming)" (124).

Chapter 7, co-written with Jim Urpeth, proposes a reflection on Bergson's explicit turn to religion in The Two Sources. The authors present Bergson's account of religion by weaving it together with Nietzsche's reaction to religion. As the authors put it, "it is instructive to bring [Bergson's thought on religion] into critical dialogue with arguably the only other comparable attempt in the modern period to articulate a naturalistic account of religion that similarly breaks the confines of a reductive sociobiology" (133). The authors demonstrate how Nietzsche's approach helps to clarify Bergson's "naturalism" while simultaneously offering a contrast to Bergson's optimistic view of the Christian mystic tradition (see 143-51). Particularly useful are their discussions of the distinction between static and dynamic religion, the idea of a "mythmaking function" present in human intelligence (133), the culmination of Bergson's identification of the limits of human intelligence as a threat to social cohesion or as a source of an existential depression (134-36), and the activity necessary for a true mystical fusion with universal love (140-43).

The final chapter, "Bergson on Education and the Art of Life," shines a light on two implicit aspects of Bergson's philosophy, namely pedagogy and philosophy as an art of living. Ansell-Pearson suggests that Bergson's focus on the tendencies of the human intellect and the processes of habit formation both provides a solid foundation for rethinking pedagogy and offers a pathway to a justifiable form of philosophical speculation. Moreover, developing our character in this way seems, for Bergson, to cast philosophy as a way of life rather than a doctrine, and even to give us the strength to live and to act in a joyful manner. This brings us back to Ansell-Pearson's key insight: Bergson's philosophy is about thinking (and even moving) beyond the human condition. This human condition is found in the spatialized structures of human intelligence, the life of mechanistic habits within a deterministic world, and the static nature of our usual religious and social existence. In other words, the human condition is a certain detachment from life as duration, and philosophy (and the style of learning it entails) provides us with the chance to reintegrate into life as a moving reality. It is thus fitting that the book culminates in a return to Bergson's notion of intuition as the way that philosophy can bring us beyond the human condition and to a certain joy in the interconnectedness that Bergson believes we find there.

Ansell-Pearson offers a fresh and lively reading of Bergson's thought and provides us with a significant number of scholarly engagements with Bergson's influences, concepts, and potential further contributions. The strong themes that return throughout the chapters establish Ansell-Pearson's reading as a coherent and important contribution, centered upon the notion of thinking beyond the human condition, making this book a welcome contribution to the ongoing resurgence of Bergson's philosophy.

[1] Frédéric Worms, “Principes généraux de l’édition critique,” in Henri Bergson, Matière et mémoire, ed. Frédéric Worms (Quadrige/PUF, 2012), 1.

[2] See Henri Bergson, Creative Evolution, trans. Arthur Mitchell (Dover, 1998), 191.

[3] See, for instance, Bergson, Matière et mémoire, 170–72.