Berkeley: Philosophical Writings

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Desmond M. Clarke (ed.), Berkeley: Philosophical Writings, Cambridge UP, 2008, 338pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521707626.

Reviewed by Stephen H. Daniel, Texas A&M University



Now that Michael Ayers’ edition of Berkeley’s Philosophical Works is no longer in print, readers looking for a volume with more than his Treatise on the Principles of Human Knowledge (1710) and Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous (1713) will have to rely on this new volume in the Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy series. This edition includes the Principles and Dialogues, Berkeley’s Essay towards a New Theory of Vision (1709), An Essay on Motion (1721), excerpts from Alciphron IV.1-18 and VII.1-15 (1732) and Siris (1744), and a 35-page introduction. It is intended for student and non-specialist use.

Clarke’s edition continues the century-old tradition of one-volume collections of Berkeley’s writings that either validate or ignore works other than the New Theory of Vision, the Principles, and the Dialogues (the three works in A. D. Lindsay’s 1910 Everyman volume). In her 1929 edition Mary Calkins added Alciphron IV (on the language of nature) and VII.16-19 (on freedom), Passive Obedience (1712) (on ethical, social, and political obligation), selections from The Querist (1735-37) (on economics) and Siris. During his collaboration with A. A. Luce on the Works of George Berkeley (1948-57), T. E. Jessop published the three standard works along with an abridged translation of De Motu and Alciphron II (on egoism) (1953). In 1965, in addition to the Vision, Principles, and Dialogues, David Armstrong added all of De Motu, some correspondence between Berkeley and the American Samuel Johnson, and selections from Berkeley’s Notebooks. Finally, in his 1975 edition Ayers extended that list by including all of the Notebooks and Berkeley’s Theory of Vision Vindicated and Explained (1733).

Each of these editions invited readers to consider aspects of Berkeley’s thought that complement his three best known works. Clarke’s additions emphasize the scientific features of Berkeley’s epistemology and generally ignore his metaphysics, theology, and ethics. To downplay the role of God, mind, or value, however, is hardly to present a balanced portrait of Berkeley. So it is unfortunate that students relying on this edition (in contrast to the Ayers edition) will not have access to Berkeley’s Theory of Vision Vindicated (where he discusses how the divine harmony of experience is expressed in the language of nature) or the Notebooks (where he comments on his contemporaries and develops an affective doctrine of mind).

Still, the present edition has the virtue of introducing readers to Alciphron and Siris. The excerpts from Alciphron show how the linguisticality of nature proves God’s existence (Dialogue IV), and argue that even though grace and force do not refer to specific ideas or things, they are meaningful concepts because of their utility in organizing experience (Dialogue VII). In this sense, Clarke argues, Berkeley is a scientific instrumentalist and an emotivist regarding religious expressions (xxvi-xxviii). The Siris selections, however, indicate how Berkeley muddles his view, because in those texts he appeals to unobservable minute corpuscles to explain the efficacy of tar water (xxxiv). Thus, in Clarke’s view, the more we learn about Berkeley’s return to a commonsense belief in bodies late in his life, the less persuasive is his commitment to immaterialism, instrumentalism, and emotivism.

This approach to understanding Berkeley — especially by someone whose edition will no doubt influence students for some time — is troubling. In describing Siris as a return to his pre-idealistic, New Theory of Vision way of speaking, Clarke imposes an interpretation onto his choice of Siris sections. If this were merely an example of selective commentary, we might chalk it up to tendentious scholarship. From an editor we expect more, because most readers will not have access to the full text of Siris or the works of 1735-37 in which Berkeley suggests an intermediate ontological status for mathematical and economic notions (e.g., money) based on systemic relations rather than either divinely-established or merely arbitrary conventions. Instead of opening up avenues of enquiry, Clarke’s Siris selections on tar-water thus problematize rather than clarify Berkeley’s philosophy. Nevertheless, some readers might be intrigued enough by these texts to think about how Berkeley’s juxtaposition of mind and minute particles can be understood in the context of his broader philosophic concerns (sec. 153 ff.).

Instead, therefore, of narrowing the study of Berkeley to his epistemology and philosophy of science, Clarke’s amalgam of works could have the effect of prompting readers to seek out Berkeley’s other works. Certainly, the texts in this collection provide only hints of how Berkeley continued to expand his philosophical reflections well after his early Principles and Dialogues. The selections here reflect little of the extensive research now being done in Europe on Alciphron‘s ethical doctrines in particular. Not surprisingly, when he drops Berkeley’s remarks about character, virtue, and morality at the end of Dialogue VII.10, Clarke reinforces the impression that Berkeley’s ideas on morality have little philosophical import. It is only when we turn to other sources to see how all ideas and perceptions are unavoidably affective that we correct that mistake (Notebooks 833, 841).

Admittedly, in his Introduction Clarke initially suggests that Berkeley’s thought is unified by his efforts to reconcile the religious concerns of his Irish heritage (embodied by Toland, Hutcheson, King, and Browne) with the philosophical views of Descartes and Locke. He then claims, however, that Berkeley “systematically confuses” his readers by “failing to observe Locke’s warning about the difference between qualities and ideas” (xvii). This failure, Clarke argues, stems from Berkeley’s refusal to appreciate the “epistemological risks” Galileo, Descartes, and Locke take when they say that some ideas are more accurate than others (xv). Of course — and this is what a sympathetic reader would have noted — Berkeley’s criticism of the distinction between qualities (or unknown powers in things to cause our ideas) and ideas is based on his belief that the distinction itself is based on an unjustified abstraction. Clarke, though, defends Locke, arguing that Berkeley “misdescribes” (in a “contrived” way) Locke’s secondary qualities as ideas that exist only in the mind (xvii). In Clarke’s view, Locke simply wants to distinguish between primary and secondary qualities in the objects of our experience. Of course, to the extent that those objects are ideas, Berkeley has no problem with the distinction. It is only by thinking that some of our knowledge refers to objects beyond our experience — as in the case of sensitive knowledge, as opposed to intuitive or demonstrative knowledge — that Berkeley has problems with locating primary qualities in objects that are not mind-dependent.

Clarke is correct, then, when he says that Berkeley “implicitly endorsed” Locke’s cautions regarding “speculating about the hidden causes of observable natural phenomena,” because Berkeley (like Locke) limits knowledge “to what is given in experience, and limit[s] the scope of knowledge to what is established by intuition or demonstration” (xviii). Nevertheless Clarke says nothing about Locke’s commitment to sensitive knowledge, and that is the crux of Berkeley’s disagreement with Locke. As Berkeley points out in Notebooks 80, “I am more certain of the existence and reality of bodies than Mr Locke, since he pretends only to what he calls sensitive knowledge, whereas I think I have demonstrative knowledge of their existence.” Locke thinks of demonstrative knowledge as a relation only of ideas (which possibly refer to things); Berkeley thinks of demonstrative knowledge as a relation between things (i.e., ideas). This is how he can say that instrumentalist hypotheses are scientifically useful without committing himself to the belief that they reveal truths of nature, which pure speculation about hidden causes promises.

In Clarke’s eyes, though, this lack of commitment prevents Berkeley from adopting the kind of attitude needed to achieve the “most creative developments” of science (xix). Berkeley’s empiricism thus “prevented him from developing a plausible account of theoretical terms in science”, because by emphasizing ideas over things, he undercut the very possibility of a realist program in science (xxx). That is why, for Clarke, Berkeley’s return in Siris to the language of physical objects happily retrieves the New Theory of Vision‘s talk of the transmission and refraction of light through “real eyes rather than ideas or perceptions of such events” (xxxiv). It is also how Siris — where “the human body was readmitted as a significant factor in our mental health” — corrects the imbalance created by Berkeley’s immaterialist works (xxxiv).

In fact, the whole immaterialist interlude raises serious questions about Berkeley’s intent. As Clarke concludes,

It remains an open question, then, whether the Bishop of Cloyne traveled to Oxford while denying the reality of the boat in which he sailed, or whether he merely claimed that his travel experiences could be described adequately in the language of phenomenalism (xxiii).

For if speaking about reality is merely speaking about what appears to us, and if what appears to us could be something other than what is real, then the idealist philosophy for which Berkeley is most known might well have been a sham.

These and other worrisome comments by Clarke indicate that students reading his Introduction will be exposed to Berkeley’s ideas in a way that fails to connect Berkeley’s epistemology with his ontology, theology, and ethics. It is no wonder, then: (1) that Clarke includes no selections from the Notebooks and the Theory of Vision Vindicated; (2) that his excerpts from Alciphron IV focus on nature as a language but omit Berkeley’s discussion of analogical predications about God (IV.19-25); and (3) that his selection from Alciphron VII (the first 15 of 34 sections) indicates how number and force have the same cognitive character as grace and Christian mysteries (e.g., the Trinity) but leaves out Berkeley’s discussion of freedom.

Compared to older translations, even Clarke’s version of De Motu misses opportunities to link Berkeley’s treatment of science to other aspects of his thought by failing to showcase his classical training. For example, in Luce’s translation, Berkeley says that the system of things in the world is moved "by the same actus", which is the same term Berkeley uses in Notebooks 701 and 828 to describe substance and will (sec. 32). By replacing actus with “action,” Clarke makes the text more accessible only by making it less resonant.

It should be noted, though, that Clarke provides helpful editorial notes that identify people or quotations mentioned in the text. Nevertheless he also makes sure to point out Berkeley’s misquotes of sources. His glossary of obsolete terms is an aid to students frustrated by early modern English, and his citations of variations in different editions provide insight into Berkeley’s on-going refinement of the texts. However, the texts in the volume are not always Berkeley’s final versions but rather composites Clarke draws together from various editions.

No doubt, such a collection cannot include every aspect of Berkeley’s thought. Nevertheless much of Clarke’s skewed Introduction — including his view that Berkeley’s notion of the human mind is “rather feeble” — is based on ignoring the Notebooks (xxix). That is truly a gap in this collection, considering how so much research in the past twenty years has drawn on them. The fact that Clarke still refers to them using Luce’s discredited misnomer (Philosophical Commentaries) indicates how this collection seems out of date already.

Because no other volume is currently available that includes works other than the Principles and Dialogues, by default, this edition will be the collection of choice for teachers interested in having their students read some of Berkeley’s other writings. Until that situation changes, instructors should recommend that students focus on the texts, find supplementary readings, and ignore the introduction.