Berkeley's Argument for Idealism

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Samuel C. Rickless, Berkeley's Argument for Idealism, Oxford University Press, 2013, 207pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199669424.

Reviewed by Melissa Frankel, Carleton University


The publication of this book coincides with the 300th anniversary of Berkeley's Three Dialogues Between Hylas and Philonous (3D), a text that Rickless argues is central in making the case for idealism, in so far as it fills in the pieces of the argument that Rickless maintains are missing from 1710's Principles of Human Knowledge (PHK). The book will be a significant addition to the libraries of Berkeley specialists, but there is much in it that will appeal to a wider audience as well, and particularly to philosophers interested in the history of the philosophy of perception and in arguments for idealism. Rickless combines the virtues of being careful and being ambitious. He is careful in canvassing extant literature and attempts to rectify what he sees as shortfalls of that literature.  He is ambitious in his attempts to offer novel accounts of the arguments from the first few sections of PHK and the first Dialogue, as well as some of Berkeley's views on perception and his ontology of sensible objects. His book has, moreover, that elusive philosophical virtue of being a good read.

The book has four chapters. In chapters 1 and 2, Rickless first considers how to cash out Berkeley's distinction between immediate and mediate perception, and then broaches the question of whether Berkeley thinks sensible objects (e.g., tables, chairs) are perceived immediately or mediately. Rickless does a remarkable job surveying the interpretive territory in what have been very thorny and complex debates in Berkeley scholarship. In chapter 1, he takes the reader through a host of passages that have been used to show sometimes that the distinction is psychological and sometimes that it is epistemic, ultimately holding with such interpreters as George Pappas and Kenneth Winkler that the distinction is primarily psychological, while nonetheless using a variety of texts to carve out his own view in contradistinction to theirs. Rickless argues that immediate perception is perception without intermediary, and in particular, that it is perception without suggestion (roughly, association of ideas) or inference.  Inference, he argues, cannot simply be reduced to suggestion, since in the Theory of Vision Vindicated Berkeley explicitly distinguishes between suggestion and inference. That said, inference does turn out, on Rickless' view, to be sometimes a type of suggestion for Berkeley, in so far as one "associate[s] premises with the conclusions [one] ha[s] derived from them" (47). Much of this chapter is quite subtle, but will be of great interest to the Berkeley scholar. Rickless' rejection of the epistemic reading, in the course of which he concedes that immediate perception is infallible but argues that this is not definitional but rather a substantive claim that follows from the transparency of immediate perception (41-42), is particularly interesting. Moreover, the view that inference can be a type of suggestion might raise intriguing questions with respect to Berkeley's theory of mind, e.g., how to understand the relationship between reason and imagination. Further questions aside, Rickless' discussion of the psychological nature of the distinction between immediate and mediate perception is ultimately quite convincing.

In chapter 2, Rickless again demonstrates his familiarity and facility with the texts and the interpretive literature. He considers three possible views: that Berkeley thinks that sensible objects are immediately perceived, that he thinks they are mediately perceived, or that the texts are contradictory and that he sometimes thinks one and sometimes the other. Rickless shows clearly that Berkeley is explicitly committed to sensible objects' being immediately perceived, but notes that passages that suggest that we mediately perceive sensible objects are not easily dismissed. Rather than accepting that the texts are contradictory, Rickless proposes a fourth view, namely, that some sensible objects are immediately perceived and some are not. He argues at 69ff that Berkeley is committed to a well-populated landscape of sensible objects. Each group of ideas immediately perceived by a single sense will count as an immediately perceived sensible object, for Rickless' Berkeley. But some sensible objects are perceived mediately, namely, those constituted by groups of ideas some of which are perceived by a single sense and some of which are suggested by those ideas (the suggested ideas might be ideas of a different sense or they might be the ideas of other perceivers). This is a clever solution that accounts particularly nicely for Berkeley's claim at 3D 247 that two perceivers can, in a manner of speaking, perceive the same sensible objects, though they do not perceive the same ideas: per Rickless, they cannot immediately perceive the same objects, but they can do so mediately (79ff).

One wonders, however, whether Rickless' Berkeley allows for the persistence of sensible objects over time. It seems not: Rickless does not talk of a single sensible moon that a perceiver immediately perceives over time, but of "a whole host of moons . . . each one numerically distinct from its predecessors thanks to Leibniz's law" (70). That said, there are well-known texts in which Berkeley does seem committed to object-persistence.[1] One can perhaps guess at Rickless' reading of such texts. He might hold that for Berkeley there is indeed a single sensible moon that exists over time, consisting of groups of ideas some of which are immediately perceived by a single sense and others of which are suggested by those ideas (namely, ideas to be perceived in the future), and that we mediately perceive this persistent moon. Rickless does not, however, explicitly address the point[2] -- perhaps because object-persistence is not directly relevant to the central question of the chapter -- and I found myself a bit sorry for the omission, if only for the sake of completeness. On a similar note, Berkeley is sometimes thought to invoke divine perception to account for object-persistence (sensible objects persist over time because God persistently perceives the ideas that constitute them).[3]  Rickless does not address divine perception at all, and one wonders what account of it he might give. Does Berkeley's God immediately perceive sensible objects? And if so, are those sensible objects identical to the ones that we immediately (or, more likely, mediately) perceive? Again, I would have liked to read Rickless' views on the matter.

In chapters 3 and 4, Rickless addresses the central question of the book, namely, how to reconstruct Berkeley's argument(s) for idealism. Chapter 3 is devoted to a discussion of PHK. After rejecting a number of readings of the argument for idealism (e.g., that Berkeley's anti-abstractionism is at the root of the argument, or that he relies on the so-called 'likeness principle,' that an idea can be like nothing but another idea, to support the argument), Rickless examines what he maintains to be the three main arguments for idealism in the initial sections of Part I of PHK. What he calls the 'semantic argument' (at PHK 3) holds that when we talk of sensible objects existing, what we mean is that they are perceived -- as he puts it, that "the proposition that the esse of sensible things is percipi is analytic" (95). This is supplemented by an argument at PHK 4 that sensible objects are ideas (because they are perceived by the senses) and an argument at PHK 1, that sensible objects are groups of ideas (because they are composed of sensible qualities, which are ideas).

Rickless suggests that the premises of these arguments are left largely undefended in PHK.[4] Consider, for instance, the argument of PHK 1, which relies on premises that Berkeley's materialist opponents would simply deny, e.g., that sensible qualities are ideas. Although Berkeley does appear to argue for such premises in PHK -- as at PHK I.10, where he argues that if secondary qualities are mind-dependent, then so, too, are primary qualities -- Rickless claims that what Berkeley produces there is merely an ad hominem against the materialist: an argument that since the materialist holds secondary qualities to be mind-dependent, then she ought to hold the same of primary qualities (124-125).[5] But what is required, per Rickless, is not an ad hominem; what is required is a positive argument in support of the claim -- and this is only provided, Rickless thinks, in 3D.

Although I think Rickless is quite right to read PHK 10, at least, as an ad hominem, I am not convinced that Berkeley would find this problematic as a support of PHK 1. After all, the criticism of PHK 1 as undefended relies on the contention that Berkeley's materialist opponent would not accept its premises; if Berkeley can show that the materialist's views themselves support the premises of PHK 1, then surely that criticism is undermined. That said, I think it is at least right to say that PHK 1 is underdefended, and that one would ultimately hope to find a positive Berkeleyan argument; Rickless locates this positive argument in the identification of sensible qualities and pains/pleasures that is found in Dialogue 1. Roughly, the argument here is that if sensible qualities are just pains or pleasures, and pains or pleasure are mind-dependent, then sensible qualities, too, are mind-dependent.

Chapter 4 is largely devoted to a discussion of this identification argument (although Rickless also considers the perceptual relativity arguments of the first Dialogue, which he largely dismisses as ad hominem). Rickless maintains that the identification argument -- in which Berkeley first claims that intense heats are identical to pains, and moderate heats to pleasures, before going on to make the case for other sensible qualities -- is more plausible than is typically thought. He defends it against a number of objections (I will not discuss them here, except to say that his defense at 150-151 against the argument that the sensation of warmth precedes the sensation of pain, and so cannot be identical to it, is both clever and delightful to read) before going on to provide his own reconstruction of the argument, which is essentially that intense heats and intense pains are phenomenally indistinguishable and hence identical, and that the same can be said of all secondary qualities. Rickless' reconstruction of the argument here is plausible, though I would have liked to see him sketch out in more detail how colour, especially, is phenomenally identical to pain.[6] For instance, what is it that is meant by 'intense colour?' A very bright yellow might be visually painful (I am not sure, but am willing to grant the possibility), but what about a highly saturated red, for instance? That aside, Rickless again in this chapter does a tremendous job of discussing both the relevant texts and the interpretive literature, and he lays out his own view in a way that both makes it plausible and also shows how the arguments of Dialogue 1 are meant both to supplement and to support the arguments of PHK.

Rickless' book provides a compelling and coherent picture of Berkeley's views on immediate and mediate perception, of Berkeley's ontology of sensible objects, and of the ways in which Berkeley's major metaphysical works, PHK and 3D, fit together. Due to the richness of the critical sections, the Berkeley specialist is in danger sometimes of getting caught up in the detail of the particular critiques and losing sight of the overarching narrative, in so far as she might be tempted to engage in the critiques herself -- I found myself constantly wanting to argue with passage interpretations, or to defend my pet views (e.g., I think there is more to be said in favour of the likeness principle's being operative in the argument for idealism, and I am not convinced that the perceptual relativity arguments are merely ad hominem). But all this means is that the book may well inspire a great deal of new scholarship on Berkeley, a result that is to be welcomed. This book is an important addition to Berkeley scholarship, and is to be roundly recommended.

[1] See, e.g., PHK 48: “It does not therefore follow from the foregoing principles that bodies are annihilated and created every moment, or exist not at all during the intervals between our perception of them;” also 3D 230-231: “Hylas: Supposing you were annihilated, cannot you conceive it possible, that things perceivable by sense may still exist? Philonous: I can; but then it must be in another mind.”

[2] Rickless obliquely addresses the issue in chapter 4, where he writes of “the vulgar error of supposing that the very same fire is immediately perceived in different ways at different times” (151), but this is ambiguous between his denying that Berkeley thinks sensible objects persist, and his taking the route that I have proposed, namely, his attributing to Berkeley the view that the very same fire can be mediately perceived in different ways at different times.

[3] See, e.g., 3D 230-231(cited above in note 2), which continues: “it necessarily follows, there is an omnipresent eternal Mind, which knows and comprehends all things.”

[4] The arguments of PHK “ultimately rest on undefended assumptions that beg the question against the vast majority of his contemporary philosophical opponents” (126).

[5] Rickless provides a similar reading of the perceptual relativity arguments at PHK 14.

[6] Nearly all he says about colours is that “intense colours are experienced as pains” (163).