Berkeley's Idealism: A Critical Examination

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Georges Dicker, Berkeley's Idealism: A Critical Examination, Oxford University Press, 2011, 310pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780195381450.

Reviewed by Benjamin Hill, The University of Western Ontario


Hume famously quipped that Berkeley's arguments "admit of no answer and produce no conviction. Their only effect is to cause that momentary amazement and irresolution and confusion, which is the result of scepticism." Georges Dicker, however, suffers from no such ill effects. Berkeley's Idealism: A Critical Examination is a thorough, penetrating, and philosophically rich critique of Berkeley's idealism. Dicker patiently analyzes Berkeley's arguments for the idealistic thesis and uncovers the sophisms and false premises that they rely on. He also astutely examines the metaphysics of mind and physical objects that grew out of Berkeley's idealism. Berkeley's Idealism deserves a place on every Berkeley scholar's bookshelf alongside Jonathan Bennett's Central Themes and Learning from Six Philosophers, Kenneth Winkler's Berkeley: An Interpretation, and George Pappas' Berkeley's Thought.

The orientation and tenor of Dicker's project are traditional, analytic history of philosophy. The contrasts between it and another new book on the same topic, Keota Fields's Berkeley: Ideas, Immaterialism, and Objective Presence, are illuminating. Unlike Fields, who seeks to establish a grandiose thesis about Berkeley's conception of ideas (namely, that Berkeley followed Arnauld in conceiving of ideas as perceptual acts rather than perceptual objects) and then to re-interpret the rest of Berkeley's metaphysics in light of it, Dicker for the most part stakes out extant positions in the scholarly literature and seeks simply to strengthen and clarify the reasons for preferring them over their alternatives. Unlike Fields's, Dicker's project presupposes a traditional narrative regarding the flow of early modern philosophy and Berkeley's place in it, namely, that Descartes had taken an epistemic turn that all mainstream philosophers followed and that consequently fixed early modern philosophy on skeptical problems arising for sense perception and representationalism. Unlike Fields, Dicker is unconcerned with contextualist details that might affect the interpretation of Berkeley's philosophy. His concern is the philosophical import of the words pulled from Berkeley's canonical texts. And finally, unlike Fields, Dicker sees no tension between the historian's role as sympathetic interpreter and the philosopher's as severe critic. Dicker's project pairs nicely with that of Jonathan Bennett.

Berkeley's Idealism is divided into four parts: Part One, "Some Themes of Mainstream Modern Philosophy, with Particular Attention to Locke"; Part Two, "Berkeley's Direct Arguments for Idealism"; Part Three, "Berkeley's Indirect Arguments for Idealism"; and Part Four, "Berkeley's Positive Metaphysics."

Part One provides some background to the critical analyses of parts two through four. It consists mainly of Dicker's interpretation of Locke's accounts of qualities and sensitive knowledge. Dicker's Locke is a two-term theorist about perception -- an adverbial theorist in fact -- whose thinking was primarily shaped by the epistemic problems stemming from sense perception. Dicker's Locke, it should be noted, is not to be identified with the historical Locke, as Dicker himself emphasizes. Dicker presents a "corrected" or "cleaned-up" (14) version of Locke's empiricism, because, according to Dicker, "one can learn the most from Berkeley by seeing how his arguments measure up against the strongest versions of the views he attacks" (4).

It must be noted, however, that these sorts of "reconstructions" are not restricted to Locke. Dicker is also willing to reconstruct positions in Berkeley. An exchange with Samuel Rickless, which Dicker reports, is indicative:

I grant that his [Rickless's] analysis limns a portion of text (from "Is not the heat immediately perceived?" to "or uncompounded idea") more closely than mine. My main reason for preferring the slightly less literal reading I have proposed is that Rickless's reading requires that the argument employ his premise (3A). This leads to my response to Rickless's third point, which is that premise (3A) is unintuitive and false as it stands, and that I see no way to amend it so as to obtain a true statement. . . . The difference between Rickless's interpretation and mine is that he attributes to Berkeley a dubious premise, whereas I attribute to him a seductive equivocation. (96-97)

Rickless's response, however, is spot on: "The fact that (3A) is unobvious (and quite possibly false) is a problem for Berkeley, not, I think, a problem for my interpretation of Berkeley." Personally, rather than asking "what amendments to these words produce something that makes senses to me," I would like to see a different question addressed, namely "what sorts of changes or differences in concepts were necessary to make (3A) appear true or plausible?" But Dicker is focused on making Berkeley (and Locke) make philosophical sense.

The critical phase of the book begins with Part Two, which addresses Principles of Human Knowledge (hereafter PHK) 1-7 and four arguments from the First Dialogue (the pleasure-pain argument; the perceptual relativity argument; something Dicker calls the argument from the principle of perceptual immediacy; and the master argument). Dicker's charge against PHK 1-7 is the familiar one that Berkeley's argument relies on an unargued assumption, i.e., the claim that all sensible qualities are ideas perceived by sense, which remains unsupported throughout PHK. Dicker concedes that Berkeley attempted to support the premise in Three Dialogues, which leads Dicker to turn to the First Dialogue.

He approaches the pleasure-pain argument first. Dicker appeals to his "dual aspect" conception of heat, color, odor, etc. to insulate the Lockean position from Berkeley's argument. The dual aspect conception is that heat is both a sensible quality and a sensation.[1] It is a sensible quality insofar as it is a capacity or disposition of something to appear in a certain way to a sentient being in certain conditions (the dispositional aspect); and it is a sensation insofar as it is a manifestation of that capacity or disposition actually occurring in a sentient being (the manifest aspect) (21). The Lockean position is thus insulated from Berkeley's argument because its first premise ("A very intense degree of heat is a great pain") can be read in two ways: one true (the manifest reading) but irrelevant to Berkeley's idealistic conclusion, and the other necessary for establishing Berkeley's conclusion but false (the dispositional reading).

Dicker next identifies two versions of the argument from perceptual relativity, one that Berkeley used against secondary qualities and another slightly stronger one that he used against primary qualities. According to Dicker, the first is invalid because in transitioning from the skeptical conclusion (that we cannot know which quality properly belongs to the sensible thing) to the idealistic conclusion (that sensible qualities exist only in the mind of the perceiver), Berkeley confuses how something seems with how something is (105-107). Dicker claims that the second version of the argument, however, can be converted to a valid argument by substituting the following premise for "An object's shape and size looks (seems, appears) different to different perceivers": "Many incompatible shapes and sizes are perceived by sense in an object" (109-110). Dicker's complaint with this improved version, however, is that there is no good reason to accept the proposed substitution: "Why should we substitute (2') for (2)? . . . Why should we not simply refuse to substitute (2') for (2)?" (115-116). The second version of the argument from perceptual relativity, then, is not strictly speaking unsound, but rather is "an unreliable argument, in the sense that it rests on a premise that there is no good reason to accept" (119).

Dicker's Berkeley's "much-neglected" argument from perceptual immediacy stems from the principle of perceptual immediacy, that "whatever is perceived by sense is immediately perceived" (122). Dicker's problem with the argument, however, is that it confuses a psychological sense of 'immediate perception', in which something is "perceived without (conscious) inference," with an epistemological sense, in which something is "perceived in such a way that we can know its existence and nature solely on the basis of the sensory experience" (129).

Part Two ends with a brief chapter on the master argument. Dicker argues that the key claim ("'I can conceive of X existing unconceived' is self-contradictory") is false because it can be understood as "I can conceive of X existing without conceiving X conceived," which is not self-contradictory (143).

Part Three concerns Berkeley's arguments against key realist planks: representationalism, the primary-secondary qualities distinction, and material substance. In Chapter Seven, "The Likeness Principle," Dicker updates his 1985 interpretation of the Likeness Principle to meet objections posed by Todd Ryan and then argues that Berkeley's argument fails because representationalists, including Locke, can easily maintain that material objects are perceived even though they are not immediately perceived (163-165). Chapter Eight focuses largely on the argument from PHK 10. Dicker again uses his dual aspect conception of qualities to insulate the realist from Berkeley's attack. Furthermore, he adds that for a two-term theorist like Dicker's Locke, PHK 10 doesn't even show that the manifest aspect of color exists only in the mind (176). The final two chapters of Part Three address Berkeley's attacks on substance. Dicker admits that PHK 16 and the First Dialogue's regress argument present powerful objections to traditional substratum theory, but he denies that they undermine a belief in material substance generally because a "friend of matter" always has the bundle theory to fall back on (193). Dicker also considers the "epistemological" argument from PHK 18-20, but in the end does not critique it. Instead, he critiques two responses to it (Charles Landesman's and Jonathan Bennett's) and contents himself with drawing the following conclusion:

Berkeley's epistemological argument cannot be answered merely by exposing questionable premises or invalid inferences or by appealing to distinctions we need to make when we philosophize about perception. Rather, an adequate response to his epistemological argument requires offering a positive account of epistemic justification (203).

Understandably, Dicker does not offer any such account in this book.

The fourth and final part contains Dicker's examinations of Berkeley's idealistic metaphysics. He begins with Berkeley's account of mind. He does not offer critical comments on this account of mind, however. Instead, he engages the secondary literature (primarily Phillip Cummins's recent work) in defending his interpretation of the account. One claim that Dicker maintains is that Berkeley denied that the mind is introspectively encountered. His basis for this strikes me as rather weak. He claims that because "any item we can find in introspection would have to have some qualitative or sensuous character" (219), if Berkeley believed that we could introspect the mind, he would have maintained that we have an idea of the mind. That however was a claim he clearly and repeatedly denied. Dicker's constraint on introspection, however, need not be accepted, and there is no evidence that Berkeley did accept any such thesis. Berkeley's division between ideas and notions was determined by the inherit activity or passivity of the objects of cognition, not by means or modes of cognition. So there seems to be nothing in principle wrong with Berkeley’s accepting, say, that a notion of God might arise from sensory experiences (see Alciphron IV.3-15) and analogously that a notion of the mind or self might come via introspection.

The next chapter sees Dicker return to criticizing Berkeley's views. He identifies two novel problems with Berkeley's account of bodies that follow from Berkeley's thesis that "all ideas of sense are caused by God" (236). That thesis pushes Berkeley to claim that bodies are orderly groups of ideas, and this thesis, argues Dicker, is incompatible with the analytically true principle that "for any person S and material object M, S perceived M at time t only if M is a cause of S's perceptual experience at t" (245). I must confess, however, that I don't see why Berkeley must concede that Dicker's principle is even true, let alone analytically true. Berkeley may be "forced into an implausible position with respect to the explanation of our perceptual experiences" (249) by rejecting Dicker's principle, but that is not the same as saying it is false. And the position does not strike me as being as implausible as Dicker makes it out to be. Dicker also sees a Kantian objection to Berkeley's thesis, namely, that Berkeley is unable to accommodate Kant's insight that there is a "distinction between the time-order in which our ideas occur and the time-order in which constituents of objects exist," which, Dicker maintains, is a "key insight into the nature of objectivity" (250).

Dicker continues his critique of Berkeley's metaphysics of physical objects by tearing down Berkeley's answers to the continuity problem. Berkeley's appeal to God as the perceiver of last resort "invites the objection that his overall position is logically circular" (258). To avoid the charge of circularity, claims Dicker, would require resting the whole case for God on the invalid passivity argument (262-263). Phenomenalist analyses of continuity (whether Berkeleian, Millian, or linguistic) fare no better, according to Dicker, because phenomenalism, especially Mill's, is such a "paradoxical" and "queer" theory.

The book ends with a chapter on "intersubjectivity," which examines the account of the identity and sameness of physical objects laid out in the Third Dialogue. Dicker considers Hylas's objection that no two people ever see the same object a "devastating objection," if true. He then argues against David Berman, George Pappas, and Robert McKim that Hylas's objection is true,[2] and that Berkeley is in fact committed "to saying that there is no common world of objects; rather there are as many distinct, self-enclosed, private worlds as there are perceivers" (281). Berkeley cannot avoid Hylas's objection, Dicker argues, because of his staunch commitment to ideas as mental images that must be essentially subjective.

Without doubt, were Dicker to pay more attention to contextualist considerations, some of his readings of Berkeley's texts would be different. For example, he claims to find Berkeley's inclusion of the "argument from the meaning of 'exist'" (PHK 3) to be mysterious because the proposition it is purported to support (namely, "(2) No idea or collection of ideas . . . can exist unperceived by a mind") "is obvious without any reflection on the meaning of the word 'exist'" (70). Because Dicker cannot uncover any purpose for the argument vis-á-vis thesis (2), he is forced to read it as an argument for the claim that "(4) houses, mountains, rivers, and all other sensible objects cannot exist unperceived." Moreover, the argument according to Dicker is rhetorically tricky because it "encourages the reader to conflate" the controversial latter claim (4) with the indisputable thesis (2) (74-75). But when viewed against the backdrop of seventeenth-century Platonism, thesis (2) is not so obvious. Platonists in fact denied that ideas always or only existed while perceived. Such a denial was central to John Norris's arguments for the division between the sensible and the intellectual realms. Thus PHK 3 can be read as Berkeley's response to Norris's Essay toward the Theory of the Ideal or Intelligible World. (Such a hypothesis makes good sense of Berkeley's claim in PHK 5 that "this tenet, it will, perhaps, be found at bottom to depend on the doctrine of abstract ideas," which Dicker also struggles to interpret.)

But Dicker's project is not about that. It is about showing us what can be said philosophically on Berkeley's behalf, and what we can say against Berkeley to avoid being forced to accept his idealistic conclusions. And in that regard, Dicker's book succeeds quite nicely.

[1] "There are two true answers to the question: 'what is the color red?' One answer is that red is the disposition of certain objects to look red to normal perceivers in normal light. The other answer is that red is the event, occurrence, or episode that constitutes the manifestation of this disposition" (21).

[2] But not the quasi-substantial interpretation of Berkeleian ideas defended by Marc Hight in Ideas and Ontology, which Dicker elsewhere cites.