Berkeley's Puzzle: What Does Experience Teach Us?

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John Campbell and Quassim Cassam, Berkeley's Puzzle: What Does Experience Teach Us?, Oxford University Press, 2014, 214pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198716259.

Reviewed by Christopher Frey, University of South Carolina


A single-authored monograph, when executed well, describes its views' opponents charitably but offers no opportunity for an immediate response. The essays in a collection, even when informed by each other, are written autonomously. This book overcomes the shortcomings of each of these forms. It is a genuine dialogue between two leading advocates of opposing positions within one of the philosophy of perception's central debates: do we perceive a mind-independent world by representing it or by standing in non-representational relations to it? This debate is far-reaching and concerns the nature of perceptual intentionality, the relationship between experience's intentional and phenomenal features, and the cognitive contribution sensory experience makes to our understanding of the world. Though there are many excellent discussions of relationalism and representationalism, I am unaware of any that is superior to this joint effort.

John Campbell and Quassim Cassam both orient their discussions around a single moment in philosophical history: Berkeley's infamous argument against our ability to perceive or otherwise cognize mind-independent objects. The sensuous blue that is consciously before us when we perceive morning glory is not among the properties mathematical physics attributes to anything. Berkeley's response to this divergence is the adoption of internalist sensationalism. Sensationalists, e.g. proponents of qualia, mental paint, sense-data, Lockean ideas, Berkeleyan sensations, etc., maintain that the qualities we consciously appreciate in sensory experience are essentially mind-dependent and do not qualify the mind-independent objects that populate our external environment. This leads to the following argument.

(B1) Sensory experience grounds our understanding and knowledge of objects and properties.

(B2) Sensory experience can only ground understanding and knowledge of itself.

(B3) So our understanding and knowledge are limited to sensory experience and its qualities.

Few would now endorse Berkeley's conclusion, but his argument leaves us with a surprisingly formidable puzzle.

Berkeley's Puzzle -- If sensory experience only reveals features of itself, how is it even possible for it to ground our understanding and knowledge of mind-independent objects?

Campbell argues that we cannot solve Berkeley's Puzzle unless sensory experience relates subjects to mind-independent objects in such a way that the objects' properties constitute experiences' qualitative characters (ch. 1). On Campbell's view, sensory experience is a three-place relation between an observer, a point of view from which a scene is observed, and the scene observed (with possible adverbial modifications, e.g. steadily or watchfully). He then describes how sensory experience grounds our understanding of mind-independence (ch. 2). He argues that sensory experience, relationally construed, can justify patterns of reasoning that exploit an understanding of objects as mind-independent (i.e., as internally causally connected and as containing mechanisms by virtue of which they transmit causal influence from place to place and over time). Campbell then explains how experience's attentional structure relates us to objects (ch. 3) and argues that experience also plays an essential role in our acquisition of propositional knowledge about the world (ch. 4).

Cassam enters the discussion fully aware of Campbell's arguments (ch. 5). Cassam raises general doubts about sensory experience's epistemic role (ch. 6). He then argues that relational accounts of sensory experience cannot solve Berkeley's Puzzle (ch. 7). Finally, he defends a version of non-conceptual, non-reductive representationalism and argues that it provides the best answer to Berkeley's puzzle (ch. 8).

After these extended discussions, there occur two short epilogues where first Campbell, then Cassam, respond to what the other has said.

1. Campbell's Argument for Relationalism

According to Campbell, we cannot avoid Berkeley's conclusion as long we adopt sensationalism. Even if sensory experience's mind-dependent qualities were reliable signs of regular, mind-independent causes, they would still be unable to furnish us with even an indirect understanding or knowledge of these causes. For (i) an experiential quality's etiology is not among its intrinsic, phenomenally appreciable features, (ii) experiential qualities can stand in many-one relations to regular causes, and (iii) entirely unconscious states can have the same etiologies. In sum, sensationalism renders sensory experience's phenomenally conscious qualitative character cognitively otiose.

One fares no better, Campbell argues, if one appeals to contents that represent the mind-independent world. For "the only accounts we have of what it is for one thing to be representing another are, in one way or another, causal accounts" (22) and there are no representational contents, so-understood, that could not in principle belong to an entirely unconscious state. So representationalism renders sensory experience's qualitative character cognitively otiose as well.

Campbell sees only one path forward: the properties of the external world's mind-independent objects must constitute sensory experience's qualitative character. G. E. Moore provides just such an account (Moore 1903) and Campbell endorses its broad strokes: (i) we can characterize the mind-independent world "at many levels," (ii) our ordinary descriptions of what we experience are "higher level" descriptions of the very same world physics describes, and (iii) to undergo a sensory experience is to stand in a relation of consciousness to the qualitatively present properties of mind-independent objects considered at this higher descriptive level. So "on the relational view, the qualitative character of the experience is the qualitative character of the object itself" (33) and "it is the presence of the mind-independent thing itself, categorically there in visual experience, that allows us to respond to Berkeley's Puzzle" (71).

Campbell motivates this Moorean turn by invoking the transparency (or diaphanousness) of experience (cf. 15, 21, 29, 50, 92, 95-98).

Experiential Transparency -- One's attempts to phenomenally appreciate properties of experience itself only result in the further appreciation of the properties that qualify the objects that are consciously present before one in experience.

Unfortunately, Campbell gives this narrowly phenomenological thesis a metaphysically substantive (and question-begging) gloss: "in sensory experience we encounter only the external, mind-independent objects themselves" (20). On its own, experiential transparency is metaphysically neutral; it discloses neither the ontological status of what we experience nor the ontological status of experience itself.

Campbell's repeated invocation of transparency is not entirely surprising as many consider the phenomenon it brings into relief probative for relationalism.[1] The objects upon which a subject is directed in sensory experience appear to be present before her in a way that the objects of phenomenally unconscious judgments and beliefs do not. What could explain this presentational character better than the very objects and properties experience is directed upon being constituents of experience? But the surface similarity between metaphysical notions like constitution and entity-dependence and phenomenological/cognitive metaphors like presence, contact, and directness does not make the former apt to explain the latter. Ontological constitution is not the right sort of explanans for experience's presentational character and, for similar reasons, is poorly suited to explain sensory experience's cognitive role.

We can see this once we expand upon Campbell's account of how sensory experience relates subjects to mind-independent objects. Campbell agrees that "We cannot say simply that the perceptual experience consists in one's being related to various objects and properties around one, without saying how the experience relates one to those objects and properties" (51). He cashes out this 'how' by analyzing "the experiential relation in terms of its attentional structure" (51).

There is a distinction in visual attention between selection and access (Huang and Pashler 2007). Selection involves making something perceptible by separating it from its background. Access involves making a previously selected object's properties explicit. Selection is therefore prior to access and "we can interpret the idea of a way of being conscious of an object in terms of the properties that are being used to select that object" (55). According to Campbell,

the correct way to formulate a relational account of perceptual experience is to think of the relation as holding between a thinker and an array of visible properties at various locations [in her visual field], available for use in the selection of objects as figure from ground (64-5).

But Campbell gives causal analyses of 'visual field' and 'visible property' and, when he argues that experiencing the latter consists in their being "available as bases for visual selection," he contends "'basing' here is a causal relation" (64). It is unclear how either this causal relation or the ontological inclusion of the worldly relatum in experience it supposedly effects would, by themselves, explain what it is for something to be "available for use in the selection of objects as figure from ground" (65). For if Campbell's own arguments against sensationalism and representationalism are sound, cognitive availability is neither a matter of causal relatedness nor mere ontological constitution. These factors can help explain which features are available but not the availability itself. Campbell could follow the path of earlier relationalists and claim that sensory experience's cognitive role is, like the cognitive role of acquaintance, epistemically primitive. This would, in the present context, provide an unsatisfying explanation but is better than providing no explanation at all.

2. Cassam's Argument for Representationalism

Cassam's orientation is diametrically opposed to Campbell's: relationalism cannot solve Berkeley's Puzzle but representationalism can. He offers two principal arguments against relationalism. (i) It fails to register the idiosyncrasies of "what the perceiver brings to the experience" (122-3) and, in particular, underestimates the ways our recognitional capacities and background beliefs affect experience's qualitative character. (ii) It does not satisfactorily explain how it is possible for us to conceive or know mind-independent objects and so fails to solve Berkeley's Puzzle.

Cassam's arguments for the second charge mirror my own reservations. According to Cassam, if sensory experience is to ground our understanding of an object's unperceived existence, "it must register the mind-independence of objects" (155). That is, "The fact that sensory experience is a relation to objects that are in fact mind-independent is neither here nor there unless the mind-independence of objects actually shows up in sensory experience" (165). But "an object's mind-independence isn't one of its qualitative characteristics" (156). So the relationalist thesis that experience "is something which simply brings objects into view and whose qualitative character is the qualitative character of the objects" (157) does not provide us with the resources to explain how experience registers the mind-independence of the objects that constitute it. As Cassam notes, objects like tables "don't tell us that they are either mind-dependent or mind-independent," and so "the conception of [them] as mind-independent can't be grounded in sensory experience if the cognitive role of my sensory experience is confined to bringing the table into view without representing it as being any particular way" (157).

Representationalism, according to Cassam, succeeds straightforwardly where relationalism fails. For "sensory experience registers the mind-independence of objects by representing them as mind-independent" (158) -- i.e. as constant and persisting -- and can do so because "the notion that some of the things we perceive are persisting space occupiers is built into the non-conceptual representational content of perceptual experience" (154). And, equally straightforwardly, it is because experience represents objects as mind-independent that it "can play a role in validating ways of thinking that reflect the mind-independence of objects" (169).

Cassam then argues that representationalism needn't render sensory experience's qualitative character explanatorily redundant. For representationalists can either (i) insist that "what [an] experience is like is specified by how it represents things as being" (174) and, following proponents of phenomenal intentionality, maintain that "the intentionality of sensory experience can be phenomenal because the phenomenal is itself intentional" (174), or, (ii) in the spirit of Kant's claim that the forms of space and time structure the way non-representational sensation is given to consciousness in empirical intuition, argue that "the representational content of sensory experience is partly explained by the structure of the phenomenal" (175). Cassam takes the first path: sensory experience non-conceptually represents objects as mind-independent, and it does so non-reductively insofar as it possesses its representational content by virtue of its phenomenal character.

3. The Epilogues

Campbell is resolute in his epilogue and continues to argue against representationalism. He claims that perceptual constancies provide only an "attenuated conception of objects as mind-independent" (185) and insists that unconscious states can nevertheless meet all of the constancy-based criteria for object representation. In the end, representationalists "hold on to some form of internalism about sensory experience: the idea that the qualitative character of sensory experience does not depend constitutively on any relations between the subject and the environment" (189). Cassam's appeal to phenomenal intentionality acknowledges a necessary connection between experience's phenomenal and intentional features. But the absence of any constitutive relations between experience's qualitative character and environmental objects entails that even phenomenal intentionality cannot "be of the slightest help in forming representations of the mind-independence of external objects" (190).

Cassam's epilogue is far from a capitulation, but it does strikes a more conciliatory tone. Cassam acknowledges that on his view, sensory experience is not "essential for a grasp of concepts of objects" (192). But to solve Berkeley's Puzzle, one need only show how it is possible for sensory experience to ground concepts of mind-independent objects. Cassam also acknowledges that his "position has both internalist and externalist elements" (199). But to deny all internalist elements is "to underestimate the subject's contribution to the qualitative character of experience" (199). On Cassam's view, (i) these internal qualitative elements are intrinsically representational, (ii) this is a (or the) basic form of intentionality, and (iii) "it can't be redundant if it is basic among the forms of intentionality" (202).[2] If Campbell's attack on representationalism is to succeed, he must provide "a clear and cogent argument against thinking of sensations as representational" (202). According to Cassam, he has not yet done so.

Despite my earlier reservations about relationalism's explanatory power, I think that Campbell has properly fixed upon something in crucial need of explanation and Cassam's response does not fully appreciate its significance. Campbell often argues that any representational content that one can attribute to a sensory experience is a content that an entirely unconscious state could, in principle, possess. Cassam agrees that unconscious states can possess the same representational contents as sensory experiences "though not in the same way that sensory experiences can have this type of content" (192). That is, sensory experiences' representational contents are instances of phenomenal intentionality and, by definition, no unconscious state can possess phenomenal intentionality. Nevertheless, whatever veridicality conditions a phenomenally intentional representational content places on an object could be captured by a representational content in which consciousness plays no role whatsoever. Cassam agrees and says that "mere perceptual states can also represent mind-independent objects" but that this "only shows that the role of consciousness in grounding our grasp of concepts of objects isn't essential" (201). But what work is experience's qualitative character playing if the representational contents it determines fix the same veridicality conditions as do the contents of states that lacks qualitative characters altogether?

Cassam is content to say that phenomenal intentionality is "basic among the forms of intentionality" (202). That is, sensory experience involves a primitive and sui generis form of representation. To be in a phenomenally conscious state is to represent experientially that something is the case. Nothing more can or need be said. If one's only concern is to provide some solution to the 'how-possible' question Berkeley's Puzzle poses, this response will do. But Campbell's arguments command a richer story about sensory experience's role in grounding our understanding of the concepts of mind-independent objects.

Though I find neither Campbell's nor Cassam's accounts entirely satisfactory, this in no way takes away from what they accomplish in Berkeley's Puzzle. Its discussions are guided by genuine insight about which philosophical questions are valuable to engage and their responses to these questions involve an unusually high clarity of thought and attention to detail. The result surpasses what either author would have achieved independently and should serve as a useful model for other philosophers to emulate.


Alston, W.P., 2005. "Perception and Representation" Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 70(2): 253-89.

Huang, L. and Pashler, H., 2007. "A Boolean Map Theory of Visual Attention" Psychological Review 114(3): 599-631.

Kriegel, U., 2013. "The Phenomenal Intentionality Research Program" in Kriegel, U. (ed.), Phenomenal Intentionality. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.

Martin, M.G.F., 2002. "The Transparency of Experience" Mind and Language 17(4): 376-425.

Moore, G.E., 1903. "The Refutation of Idealism" Mind 12: 433-53.

Snowdon, P., 1990. "The Objects of Perceptual Experience" Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supp. Vol. 64: 121-50.

[1] See, for example, Alston 2005, Martin 2002, and Snowdon 1990.

[2] Cassam takes himself to be following the lead of Kriegel 2013.