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Daniel E. Flage, Berkeley, Polity, 2014, 202pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745656342.

Reviewed by Walter Ott, University of Virginia


Future historians of philosophy will have to conclude that ours is a golden age of pedagogical texts. Each year brings a fresh harvest of introductions, encyclopedias, surveys, companions, and guidebooks. One has to wonder a bit about the wisdom of expending all of this collective effort. Is the demand large enough to sustain the industry, or is it just that libraries can be relied upon to buy these things? And is the range of topics that need introducing and companioning broad enough to warrant the proliferation of these books? The Blackwell Guide to Just-Before-Teatime June the Seventh, 1675, in the Thomson household of Upper Mortonshire is, if not forthcoming, surely inevitable.

There is a special problem in evaluating books aimed at readers who are new to a text or figure. It is easy -- too easy -- to complain that the author has ignored this distinction, or left out this or that argument or objection. Such charges seem not quite fair. For her part, the author needn't give any detailed argument for her interpretation, or defend it from others. (Maybe that's part of the appeal of writing these things.) I usually come away from such texts with the feeling that I have not spent my time wisely, and that the book, being (trivially) not the one I would have written, is not quite suitable for my students.

So I am happy to report than Daniel E. Flage's Berkeley, the latest entry in Polity Press's Classic Thinkers series, is an exception. Flage's text is squarely aimed at the reader new to Berkeley's work (though not to philosophy in general), helpfully alerting the autodidact to the correct pronunciation of 'Bark-lee' (1). And yet there is much here to interest even those who specialize in the modern period. Writing a book that satisfies both desiderata is no mean feat, and Flage accomplishes it with aplomb.

The design of Flage's book makes it engaging and easy to follow. There are eight chapters, each ending with section titled 'A Look Back; A Look Ahead,' and suggestions for further reading. A ninth concluding chapter sums up the results and invites the reader to work through Berkeley's texts on her own, since, as Flage notes, 'any secondary source only gives one person's attempt to make sense of the texts' (180). In what follows, I'll discuss each chapter in turn.

The opening chapter makes a good case for studying Berkeley in the twenty-first century before introducing the reader to his life and works. Flage weaves in a number of interesting details about Berkeley -- for instance, that in solidarity with the sufferers of the 1740-1 famine, he declined to powder his wig with flour (14). Flage's methodology is clear: he will attempt to give as sympathetic a reading of Berkeley as possible. At times, it does seem as if the degree of charity he extends to Berkeley means he has to stint on the same commodity where other philosophers, especially Locke, are concerned. But given the distance between Berkeley's views and those the reader is likely to bring to the text, Flage's strategy makes sense.

The second chapter is devoted to the New Theory of Vision. Flage's distinctive contribution here is to glean from the text a method. Following a hint from Berkeley himself in the later Theory of Vision Vindicated and Explained, Flage argues that the New Theory follows the method of analysis. Analysis begins with a supposition (in this case, that distance is not perceived directly), and then offers an explanation that makes the supposition true (the correlation of visual and tactile ideas, which allows for the indirect apprehension of distance.) This method of analysis, which is 'comparable to what later philosophers called abduction or argument to the best explanation' (177), features prominently in the rest of the book. In particular, as we'll see, Flage reads the first thirty-three sections of Part I of the Principles of Human Knowledge as an instance of that method. In Flage's hands, the method is in some sense epistemological, rather than metaphysical; and this is the key to his defense of Berkeley, as we'll see.

How are we to understand the distinction? Flage tells us that Berkeley's approach in the New Theory is epistemological in the sense that it 'makes appeals to factual evidence, while a metaphysical approach countenances mere possibilities' (23). This is a rather idiosyncratic use of these terms: metaphysics is of course concerned with factual evidence, and epistemology typically uses thought experiments that appeal to 'mere' possibilities. It is especially odd, since Flage himself will need to use these words in their more usual senses elsewhere in the book (see esp. 44). To see how the distinction works, consider his defense of Berkeley's incommensurability argument. Berkeley argues that it is impossible to add visual and tactile points, and so such points must really be of different kinds (23). Marc Hight has argued that there might be another sense, like smell, that would allow us to measure a line composed of visual and tactile points.[1] Flage's Berkeley dismisses this possibility; his epistemological approach entitles him to say that, if it is 'factually impossible' to add visible and tactile points, then the two points are of different kinds (23).

Chapter three examines the attack on abstract ideas. Flage argues persuasively that Locke is not Berkeley's sole target, and gives a good account of the way Berkeley's arguments in the introduction to the Principles, as well as Alciphron, work. Readers often conclude that Berkeley endorses a broadly Cartesian model, whereby a general term signifies (indifferently) some determinate idea, and that idea is made to signify or stand for all others in its resemblance class. Flage argues that in fact Berkeley rejects the need for a mediating idea, allowing a word to signify or denote an entire resemblance class directly. In this chapter, his charity toward his subject becomes a bit troubling: Berkeley's appeal to resemblance is notoriously problematic, and some suggestion of the traps of circularity and absurdity that await it would have been welcome. And Flage seems, like Berkeley, to take Locke at his word when he confesses that abstract ideas are logically inconsistent (52), something even the least charitable readers of Locke have hesitated to do.

Flage's most ambitious work, however, comes in chapter four, which covers the case for Berkeley's ontology in the Principles. Flage reads the first seven sections of Part I as an argument for idealism, the view that everything is either a mind or dependent on one, and sections eight through twenty-four as an argument for immaterialism, the view that matter does not exist. (As Flage notes, Descartes thinks that everything depends on a mind, namely, God's, and yet he believes in matter; so idealism should not be confused with immaterialism.) On Flage's view, these arguments have often been underestimated because their epistemological character has been ignored (58).

As with the New Theory, Flage reads the Principles as following the method of analysis. He begins with the assumption that there are knowers (minds) and things known (ideas). In the opening sections of Part I, Berkeley says nothing about the essences or natures of these things: minds are just whatever does the perceiving, and ideas are just things-as-known. Next, Berkeley infers to the best explanation: knowers are immaterial minds, and ideas are passive, immaterial, and mind-dependent. Finally, he appeals to parsimony to rule out any other supposed entities (95).

As Flage notes, Berkeley's conclusion seems to be stronger: he does not merely say that matter doesn't exist; he says that it can't exist; indeed, if matter can even be shown to be conceivable, Berkeley is happy to admit defeat (Principles Part I sections 22-4). Or, to take another example, Berkeley says that it is impossible for there to be a likeness between ideas and anything else (Principles section 8). How is Flage's Berkeley entitled to these stronger conclusions?

As far as I can tell, Flage's reply is that he isn't; but that's okay, because he doesn't really make these stronger claims. Consider first the case of resemblance. Flage's Berkeley is using an epistemic version of the inconceivability criterion of impossibility, or ICIE: 'If I cannot, in fact, form an idea of p, then it is impossible to know that p exists' (73). So when Berkeley speaks of the impossibility of resemblance between an idea and a non-idea, what he means is only that it's impossible for us to know whether there is a resemblance or not. Hence there are no grounds for positing such a likeness. Similarly, when Berkeley says that, for ideas, their esse is percipi, he doesn't really mean that; he means, instead, that the 'criterion for the existence of an idea is that it is known' (62). Since 'idea' at this stage of the argument just means 'something as known,' the claim is close to trivial. However that may be, one wonders how epistemological premises are going to yield metaphysical conclusions, absent some kind of verificationism.

Consider Flage's take on the argument against primary qualities: 'Insofar as his ontology follows his epistemology, there is no ground for claiming that primary qualities exist apart from secondary qualities. So, primary qualities cannot exist apart from secondary qualities' (76). On its face, this seems fallacious. But Flage's real argument is that Berkeley is willing to admit an entity only if it can be known (79). So absent a ground for positing x, we can say x does not exist.

Whether this amounts to a charitable reading of Berkeley or not I leave to the reader to judge. I will just note that ICIE seems either to be vacuous or unjustified. If it means that my inability now to form an idea of x entails that I cannot now know whether x exists or not, it's trivial. If it is the stronger claim that my inability now to form an idea of x entails that no one can or will ever know whether x exists or not, it's unjustified.

Whatever one makes of Flage's reading of the arguments for immaterialism and idealism, it certainly doesn't lack for originality and boldness, two qualities sorely lacking in works of this genre. Flage equips the reader with the ability to test his interpretation for herself, another rare feature in such works.

Chapter five is an insightful discussion of the Three Dialogues. Although commentators typically flit back and forth between that text and the Principles, Flage helpfully points out the very different goal of the Dialogues: Philonous argues that immaterialism entails fewer skeptical consequences than the alternative and possesses all of the theoretical virtues of materialism and more (98). As a result, the Dialogues do not deploy the method of analysis found in the earlier works.

In chapter six, Flage turns to Berkeley's philosophy of mind. This chapter is a highlight of the book, as he cleverly unties the knots into which Berkeley twisted himself. Flage rejects his own earlier interpretation of notions as definite descriptions.[2] Instead, he now recognizes that Berkeley thinks we somehow have an immediate grasp of our own minds. On Flage's revised reading, a reflex act allows the subject to know that her mind exists; its nature is the object of intuitive knowledge. The only point in Berkeley's philosophy of mind for which Flage does not adequately account is the denial, in Principles I section 49, that ideas are modes. Berkeley seems to think that if ideas were modes, then the mind would take on whatever quality the idea has or represents. Flage notes that 'as far as [he] know[s], Berkeley's contemporaries avoided this absurdity' (119). But Nicolas Malebranche, an important source for Berkeley, as Flage is aware, in fact embraced exactly that conclusion.[3]

The seventh chapter is devoted to Berkeley's moral theory. Flage persuasively argues that Berkeley begins his career, in the Notebooks, as an ethical egoist and never really abandons that position. Later works invoke the notion of natural law, but such a theory is in fact just a generalized form of ethical egoism: each person 'ought to seek whatever is in her long-term self interest' (162). Berkeley avoids becoming Ayn Rand only because those long-term interests include avoiding hell and gaining heaven. Here again some criticism of Berkeley's view would have been welcome: can anyone seriously believe that, in some situations, one ought to commit murder for personal gain, if only God weren't around to impose the ultimate punishment?

The eighth chapter covers Berkeley's views on economics. Apart from his suggestion that money, being only a kind of counter, need not be backed up by any association with precious metals (174), Berkeley's views border on the repugnant. Here again, Flage does his best to give a sympathetic account, but Berkeley doesn't make it easy. Even during times of famine, Berkeley never supported any kind of tax on the wealthy to support the poor. Instead, the poor are for the most part lazy and lack the proper incentives to work. It might be instructive to imagine what Karl Marx and Paul Ryan, respectively, would think of Berkeley's remedy for indolence:

Whether the creating of wants be not the likeliest way to produce industry in a people? And whether, if our peasants were accustomed to eat beef and wear shoes, they would not be more industrious? (Query 20, discussed on 171)

In other passages from the Querist, Berkeley admires the Dutch workhouses, which 'are so managed that a child four years old may earn its own livelihood' (Query 373, discussed on 173). Although Berkeley devoted a number of pages to criticizing the wealthy for importing their luxuries when they might help the local economy by cultivating a taste for Irish mead, nothing Flage says corrects the reader's impression that Berkeley was a naïve if well-intentioned nob with an unreflective contempt for the poor, however unfloured his wig might be.

All in all, then, Flage's book is a welcome addition to the Berkeley literature. One might have wished for broader coverage to include not just the areas Flage notes -- mathematics and natural science (179) -- but also free will, occasionalism, and philosophy of science. And I have noted some points of controversy. Nevertheless, Flage's Berkeley is, in my view, the best introduction to its subject available

[1] Ideas and Ontology: An Essay in Early Modern Metaphysics of Ideas (University Park: University of Pennsylvania Press, 2008), 237.

[2] See his Berkeley's Doctrine of Notions: A Reconstruction Based on His Theory of Meaning (London: Croom Helm, 1986).

[3] Malebranche writes, 'You even make a fool of yourself before certain Cartesians if you say that the soul actually becomes blue, red, or yellow, and that the soul is painted with colors of the rainbow when looking at it. There are many people who have doubts, and even more who do not believe, that when we smell carrion the soul becomes formally rotten, and that the taste of sugar or of pepper or salt, is something belonging to the soul' (Elucidation XI in The Search After Truth, trans. T.M. Lennon and P. Olscamp (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997, 634)).