Berkeley's Three Dialogues: New Essays

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Stefan Storrie (ed.), Berkeley's Three Dialogues: New Essays, Oxford University Press, 2018, 217 pp., $50.00 ISBN 9780198755685.

Reviewed by Marc A. Hight, Hampden-Sydney College


George Berkeley arguably has risen in the ranks of early modern philosophers in terms of philosophical esteem. A good deal of scholarly work on the Irish philosopher has emerged since the turn of the century, taking Berkeley's thought seriously or at least seriously enough to engage carefully. Stefan Storrie's anthology dedicated to the Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous comes from papers delivered at a conference in 2014 celebrating the 300th anniversary of the work's publication in 1713. All of the papers have an analytical approach to a variety of philosophical and textual issues that arise in Berkeley's work.

The editor's introductory chapter is primarily an essay in apologetics: given that A.A. Luce and T.E. Jessop pronounced that the Principles and not the Three Dialogues is "the complete and final expression of Berkeley's immaterialism,"[1] Storrie argues (2-3) that there is nonetheless a case to be made for giving the later work a proper place of its own. The case is easy enough to make, and the articles in this anthology make it simply through their argumentation and textual analysis. That the Three Dialogues is not merely a derivative rehash of the earlier Principles emerges naturally from the philosophical subtleties of their differences. One might justly wonder whether it is time to let at least some of the implicit authority of Luce and Jessop in all matters Berkeley fade a bit.

The book is unified by the intersection of the individual articles in some manner with the Three Dialogues. The topics range broadly from the nature of sense perception to Berkeley's alleged Platonism. Some of the essays are less about the Three Dialogues than about topics that happen to be mentioned in the work, but the overall quality of the articles is relatively even. The volume is a scholarly contribution to early modern literature and worthy of attention and study, but the subtitle is perhaps a bit misleading. Most of the essays might be new in the sense of first being published in the volume (although that is not true for all of them), but they largely engage issues that are well worn in the Berkeley literature. The volume does not contain any articles that one might consider groundbreaking or 'new' in the sense of advancing theses or interpretations that have not already been engaged in the secondary literature (often by these same authors themselves). As is typical for short reviews of anthologies, I cannot give the proper attention due to each of the articles but will nonetheless strive to mention each of them.

In "Sensible Qualities and Secondary Qualities in the First Dialogue," Lisa Downing accomplishes her admittedly "modest" aim of noting differences between the Principles and the Three Dialogues with respect to Berkeley's attack on material mechanism. The former, argues Downing, does so by engaging the representative theory of perception while the latter targets the primary-secondary quality distinction. As Downing herself notes, her article is partly an extension of Margaret Wilson's work on the primary-secondary quality distinction in Berkeley,[2] but the analysis includes a discussion of Berkeley's response to the 'doctrine of double-existence' which is a useful addition.

Tom Stoneham's "Some Issues in Berkeley's Account of Sense Perception" contends that Berkeley's understanding of common sense objects should be construed such that we do not need to perceive even most of the ideas that constitute the object in order to perceive it. The topic has a venerable history, but Stoneham's analysis includes some subtleties and a useful review and engagement of two important recent theories (that of Georges Dicker and George Pappas) of what constitutes immediate perception for Berkeley. Ultimately Stoneham's view is that by attributing a more reasonable position to Berkeley -- namely that the perception of a common sense object like a chair does not require that we perceive all of the ideas that otherwise constitute the object -- we can make better sense of Berkeley's immaterialism.

"Berkeley on the Objects of Perception" sees Jennifer Smalligan Marušić considering more deeply an alternative act-object theory of perception. Perhaps Berkeley's foil in the work, the materialist Hylas, might have better defended materialism by more forcefully distinguishing acts of the mind from objects immediately perceived. Marušić endorses a defense of Berkeley that makes sensible qualities the mind-dependent objects of perception and not perceptual acts.

Keota Fields engages the issue of the ontological status of ideas given Berkeley's views about the divine mind in "Berkeley's Semiotic Idealism." How should one reconcile Berkeley's claim that all ideas are mind-dependent with his claim that God maintains order in the sensory world? The difficulty is motivated in part by Fields's claim that "an idea is internal to the mind that perceives it just in case its existence depends on its being perceived by that mind." (61). His analysis rests on a common assumption, namely that the sensory ideas perceived by minds must be private to them. Yet it is not clear that such is Berkeley's position. There is no requirement that ideas be perceived only by the mind perceiving in that instance (see, e.g. Principles section 6, where Berkeley explicitly indicates that ideas must be supported by his own mind, that of another finite mind, or by a divine mind). Again, the topic has a history in the literature, although Fields does not engage the assumption about privacy.[3] He concludes that, for Berkeley, sensible objects are "composites of internal and divine ideas whose perception is prescribed by universal rules." (82). His solution invokes linguistic norms that determine the ordering of sensory ideas.

In "Berkeley's Argument for the Existence of God in the Three Dialogues", Samuel Rickless presents and analyzes the differences between the arguments Berkeley gives for the existence of God. This an excellent summary of the topic and includes some careful analysis of the details of the arguments themselves.

In "Berkeley on Continuous Creation: Occasionalism Contained," Sukjae Lee presents another article in a series concerning his work on occasionalism in Berkeley. This article is reprinted.[4] Lee argues that Berkeley is an occasionalist about bodies, but preserves genuine causal power for finite minds in terms of the creation of ideas of imagination. The emphasis in this piece is on Berkeley's lukewarm commitment to the principle of continuous creation. Unsurprisingly, Lee argues that Berkeley is not strongly committed to the principle (at least not as strongly as Malebranche and other contemporaries are). Instead, Berkeley's occasionalism is "bottom-up" and less theologically driven. Lee contends that Berkeley is "constraining" his occasionalism (118) to fit his immaterialist metaphysics rather than making concessions in his metaphysics to accommodate theological concerns.

James Hill develops and argues for a theory of the self in Berkeley that he calls "active perception." In "The Active Self and Perception in Berkeley's Three Dialogues," Hill seeks to resolve the tension implicit in "Berkeley's view that an active self is the subject of perception when perception itself is construed as utterly passive" (123). The key for Hill is to distance Berkeley from the view that perception must be a purely passive affair. That much seems clear, and Hill contributes to the literature defending the same position. On Hill's version, "the mind actively unites the passive perceptions of different sense modalities into the objects of experience" (134). As a result, the mind is continuously active -- an orthodox upshot that nonetheless nicely brings the issues together.

In "Berkeley on God's Knowledge of Pain," Stephen H. Daniel seeks to provide Berkeley with a consistent and plausible position with respect to God's possession of sensory knowledge -- especially pain. To suffer pain would make God both passive and defective, two consequences Berkeley is most keen to avoid. Daniel proposes an interesting solution, arguing that God's ideas are identical to those of finite minds, but only in the sense that God perceives them as a comprehensive whole. Thus, God does not perceive this particular instance of pain (that you or I might be experiencing passively now), but knows the pain as one part of the entirety of sensory experience. Pain for finite minds is thus not quite what one might typically think. Daniel writes, "this appropriate experience of ideas as incompatible is what we experience as pain (144)." The solution is intriguing, but I want to mention two issues in passing. First, the paper would profit from even a brief engagement of the Incarnation (which only gets a passing mention in a footnote and is neglected in the literature), where one might argue that God obtains direct knowledge of pain as Christ. Second, Berkeley does indicate that God knows and perceives all of the ideas that finite minds do. In the Three Dialogues, Philonous notes that "God knows or hath ideas; but His ideas are not convey'd to Him by sense, as ours are" (241). That knowledge is not sensory, but it does seem to be particular for both finite minds and the divine mind. More textual evidence for the supposition that sensory ideas have this unusual nature would be welcome to strengthen Daniel's thesis.

John Russell Roberts makes his case for Neoplatonic influences on Berkeley in "A Puzzle in the Three Dialogues and Its Platonic Resolution." What puzzles Roberts is that Berkeley does not seem to issue a blanket rejection of the pure intellect even though he ardently rejects perhaps the paragon example of an exercise of the pure intellect: abstract ideas. Making the issue more complicated is Berkeley's acceptance of the possibility of innate ideas. How can Berkeley reject abstract ideas but admit innate ones? Roberts proposes that Berkeley adopts a Neoplatonic position inspired by Cudworth. According to a sketch of Neoplatonic thought outlined by Roberts, finite minds are created in the image of God insofar as we will and act morally. That is, there is an 'ethical ought' that governs creative authority. When we will analogously to how God wills, we do so as moral reasoners. Roberts then alleges that Berkeley treats the self as an essentially moral reasoner, which well fits the Neoplatonic view of the self, based on an active/passive distinction. That such a view can be attributed to Berkeley seems plausible, even though the analysis is speculative (as Roberts admits) and the evidence is suggestive as opposed to conclusive. Exactly how this conception of self explains why Berkeley kept innate ideas while abandoning abstract ones is not entirely clear from the piece, but the reading is promising.

Storrie offers an interesting discussion entitled "The Scope of Berkeley's Idealism in the 1734 Edition of the Three Dialogues." The piece discusses how Berkeley gets to his claim that only minds and ideas exist. Storrie identifies four "possibilities" for what Berkeley might mean when he appeals to his principle of immaterialism (162). He concludes by attributing to Berkeley the view that his immaterialist principle is like a scientific hypothesis: it can be falsified by empirical evidence, but it is not otherwise susceptible to empirical 'proof.' This nicely explains why Berkeley engages the concept of absolute space. He thinks that if there is absolute space (and if this can be reasonably shown), then such a revelation would undermine his immaterialist principles. But Berkeley thinks the arguments for absolute space fail, and so rests content in defending the reasonable possibility of his theory.

Kenneth L. Pearce tries to resolve another potential tension in Berkeley's thought in "Matter, God, and Nonsense: Berkeley's Polemic against the Freethinkers in the Three Dialogues". Pearce worries about an odd comment Berkeley makes in his Notebooks, where he reminds himself to give no offense to his fellow churchmen. Yet Berkeley explicitly targets freethinkers -- alleged atheists aligned against the faithful. Why would Berkeley be worried about offending the churchmen while defending the church against freethinkers? Pearce's answer is that the nature of Berkeley's attack requires that one let go of important bits of rarefied philosophical theology (a commitment to divine analogy in particular). Thus, Berkeley thinks that ordinary faith (views of the vulgar) is sufficient to refute atheistic challenges, but nonetheless might offend the sensibilities of theologians. Pearce has defended this rough line of interpretation previously, but the article is well-reasoned and compellingly put together.[5]

The last article is Don Garrett's "Hey, What's the Big Idea?: Berkeley and Hume on Extension, Local Conjunction, and the Immateriality of the Soul." Garrett contends that both Berkeley and Hume are committed to the claim that some ideas are literally extended. He then expounds about some of the consequences of this claim, primarily for Hume, given that both philosophers take minds to be non-extended. Garrett is careful to note that saying that some ideas are extended does not imply that perception is extended or that those ideas (or minds) must be spatially located (196). One of the main problems for Hume is that his previous commitment to causal bundling and constant conjunction make co-perception especially difficult. On Hume's view, whether two simultaneous perceptions are had by the same mind or not depends on prior (causal) relations and not any synchronic relations between the ideas themselves (200). After presenting other problems for Hume (including complications about whether there are minds at all), Garrett notes that Berkeley has the resources for a kind of solution. For Berkeley, minds are substances on which ideas are ontologically dependent. Yet that dependence need not be one of inherence; hence, there is no necessity that minds perceiving extended ideas must likewise be extended (and a discussion of Principles 49 follows). The territory, at least for Berkeley scholars, is familiar. One might have preferred to see some added subtlety introduced by the fact that Berkeley is also committed to the heterogeneity of ideas. The extendedness of a visual idea is distinct in kind from the extendedness of a tactile idea. Nonetheless, the piece is smartly argued.

Storrie has selected and edited twelve scholarly articles joined by the theme of having relevance to Berkeley's Three Dialogues. Each of the articles is a quality scholarly contribution to the field. The book will no doubt be of use to Berkeley specialists (as a whole but more likely in parts), if not necessarily for the groundbreaking theses, then for the solid quality of the arguments and presentations of core themes in the field.

[1] Quoting Arthur A. Luce, The Life of George Berkeley, Bishop of Cloyne (Thomas Nelson and Sons, 1949), 48.

[2] Margaret Wilson, “Did Berkeley Completely Misunderstand the Basis of the Primary-Secondary Quality Distinction in Locke?” in Berkeley: Critical and Interpretative Essays. Edited by Colin Turbayne. University of Minnesota Press, 108-23.

[3] See for instance, Leopold Stubenberg, “Divine Ideas: The Cure-all for Berkeley’s Immaterialism,” Southern Journal of Philosophy 27: 221-49 and Marc Hight, Idea and Ontology (Penn State University Press, 2008), esp. chapter 7.

[4] See Research in Philosophy and Phenomenology, 62 (Sept. 2014): 71-102. Lee has published a number of good articles on this same topic. See, e.g. Sukjae Lee, “Berkeley on the Activity of Spirits,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 20, no. 3 (2012): 539-76.

[5] See Kenneth Pearce, “Berkeley’s Philosophy of Religion,” in The Bloomsbury Companion to Berkeley. Edited by Richard Brook and Bertil Belfrage. (Bloomsbury Academic, 2017): 458-83.