Bernard Williams

Placeholder book cover

Alan Thomas (ed.), Bernard Williams, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 221pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521665551.

Reviewed by Catherine Wilson, The Graduate Center, CUNY


Six of the seven essays in this volume are addressed to Bernard Williams's moral philosophy and moral epistemology chiefly as they were developed in his Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy and his Shame and Necessity. Issues discussed include his critique of the "morality system;" his skepticism about objective moral knowledge; his views on motivation, obligation, responsibility, shame, and guilt; and his treatment of "thick" and "thin" moral concepts. A final chapter ventures into topics treated in his last book, Truth and Truthfulness. The collection contains two truly stellar pieces, one by John Skorupski, on internal and external reasons, and another by A.A. Long, on Williams's reading of Greek philosophy, as well as several that pleased this reviewer less. Overall, it is a stimulating addition to the growing literature on Williams.

For Williams, scientific and moral inquiry were sharply differentiated forms of investigation. Scientific inquiry aims at mapping or representing a single world that is, as Alan Thomas puts it, "maximally independent of our perspective and its peculiarities." (p. 52). The scientific image of the world as it would be described by competent investigators at the limit of inquiry is what Williams meant by the "absolute conception" of reality; we do not have it, but it serves as a coherent regulative ideal. Evaluative propositions, Williams maintained, would not appear in this ideal science, and there is neither an "absolute conception" of moral reality that could serve as the goal of inquiry, nor a set of moral terms that could perform in the way the terminology of natural science performs. He conceived the social world instead as a bundle of many different sets of local occurrences and practices -- how many sets it is impossible to say -- to each of which a set of "thick" concepts, referred to in our linguistic practice by terms such as "honorable" or "disgusting," whose descriptive content cannot be specified independently of the evaluative attitude implied by the term, was applied, sometimes contested, and often agreed upon.

While some criticism of Williams's position on the discreteness of scientific and moral inquiry has come from moral realists, another line of questioning has come from metaphysicians who doubt that the absolute conception is an appropriate guiding ideal for empirical science. Even the best possible scientific image of the world, they maintain, will be one constructed by organisms with sensory systems and with quantitative and representational capacities that are limited and contingent. Science may not be culturally relative, but it is false that our world could be described in a manner that all possible natural scientists could agree on. All this is well-explained in the opening chapters by A.W. Moore and Alan Thomas. Moore defends Williams's contrast, exonerating him from the charge of naïve scientism, and he does so in part by pointing to its relationship to Nelson Goodman's theory of "world-versions." Thomas, in turn, is concerned about Williams's contention that a society that comes to doubt the objectivity of what it took to be its own moral knowledge can only struggle to go on acting and judging through the impetus of confidence, rather than from the conviction that it is acting on the basis of objective knowledge. Deep error is possible, he thinks, even and perhaps especially in the most confident societies. He argues that Williams's argument is overextended, and that a form of context-sensitive cognitivism can preserve what is right about Williams's critique of the notion of objective moral knowledge without throwing out the possibility of rational inter-system comparison. Meta-ethicists are very fond of taxonomy, which often does quite a bit of work for them on its own, but I was not sure exactly how this contextualist cognitivism was meant to work and would have appreciated re-analysis of some of Williams's own examples of cultures that are impenetrable to one another with respect to moral criticism.

Edward Craig's essay on arguments from the state of nature is as witty, insightful and wide-ranging as everything else by this author, though readers are warned that to make sense of it fully, they will have to have had the pleasure of reading Craig's book on Knowledge and the State of Nature, not just Williams's book on truth. Craig is concerned with the way in which accounts of the origins of practices -- the placation rituals of religion, as Hume studied them; or the sacrifices and benefits of the social contract, as Hobbes described them; or the origins of morality in resentment, as Nietzsche portrayed them -- play a role in discrediting or justifying those practices. He is well-disposed towards Williams's appeal to the genealogy of the practice to explain the value of truth telling, eschewing deontological and transcendental stories of its obligatoriness.

I was least satisfied with the essays of Robert Louden and Michael Stocker. Louden defends Kant against Williams's charges that he was "pathologically obsessed" with the concept of obligation, that he denied that emotional response had any role to play in ethics, and that he believed, absurdly, that real duties could never conflict. Louden produces quotations to show that Kant has a softer line on the issues, that e.g., he thinks sympathy should be cultivated; and where this is impossible, e.g., in the case of conflict of duties, he simply insists that Kant has a credible position. But Williams was, so to speak, playing hardball in his challenges to the Kantian and post-Kantian tradition, and the best way to deal with this is to hit back pretty hard, not to, in effect, present him with a gentler and less rigid Kant. Williams should be brought up, one feels in this connection, on explicit charges of philosophical narcissism, and invited to answer for some of his more disturbing statements. Skorupski's and Long's essays accomplish this, but so deftly and appreciatively that the blade slides in without making any kind of mess.

Stocker's essay takes on Williams's distinction between "shame" and "guilt." Shame, Williams thought, was a moral emotion that arose from an agent's awareness that he or she had failed to live up to a certain ideal of what kind of person to be, whereas guilt arose from the failure to supply to others what they have led the agent to believe is their due. Stocker points out that shame and guilt can indeed be prized apart. One can be ashamed of an embarrassing social mishap where no wrong was done and there is no guilt, and one can also acknowledge formal guilt in failing to comply with some rule one does not respect without feeling ashamed. Still, both shame and guilt are present in many cases of moral failure, and so Williams's notion that modern moral philosophy was corrupted by an overemphasis on guilt arising from failures to render others their perceived due, is not well substantiated. This all seems right, but somehow I felt this essay should have pushed things farther, perhaps by defending the centrality of guilt as a moral concept in the modern world if Stocker thinks it deserves defending. He does say that that Gauguin should probably (?) (p. 144) have stayed with his family and painted at home rather than gone to Tahiti. It isn't clear why, however; nobody in Williams's story even asks him not to go to Tahiti. (Compare the Gauguin case with the case of Ajax mentioned below.)

With Skorupski's excellent, probing essay on internal and external reasons, one has the sense that nothing more needs to be written or read on this subject. Skorupski patiently untangles what is importantly true, what is outrageous, and what is somewhat true but exaggerated in Williams's claim that reasons for an agent to do or abstain from some action must be reasons that are properly tied to his beliefs and desires, or to those that are within near reach for him. Skorupski agrees that modern ethical thought tends to "credit everyone with comprehensive moral agency" (p. 99) and that Kant was wrong in ascribing to all an equal and flawless ability to respond to moral reasons, for, empirically, agents vary on these dimensions. Williams was right, he maintains, to urge us to see "people, their feelings, and their practices as they are, without undue optimism, and with the help of whatever empirical findings we have" (p. 102), but he need not have relativized reasons to agents as thoroughly as he did.

Long's essay is in turn a masterpiece of sympathetic yet critical analysis. He praises Williams's "ruthless honesty" and his impatience with "anything that smacks of conceptual fuzziness or pietistic edification" along with his literary and linguistic skills, but he is far from being taken in. He explains engagingly Williams's rejection of the "progressivist" views of Bruno Snell and Arthur Adkins, who thought the Homeric heroes lacking in important moral dimensions of self-awareness and autonomy. Long rescues their reputations while at the same time arguing that Williams was essentially right in finding the Homeric heroes deep in ways that they did not. Long questions whether Ajax's suicide, after he is seemingly convinced by his wife's pleas not to leave her a widow, and his father and his son bereft of support, is beyond moral objection as Williams implies it is. (Williams's verdict on his "Susan" case of a despondent teenager who needs to be prevented from killing herself, because things will be better in three months, is interestingly compared with his verdict on Ajax.) Even if an experienced adult loses a sense of the significance his life has for others, the fact that it does, and that he has been made aware that it does, seems to be a reason for staying alive. Nietzsche, it might be recalled, in an unusually other-directed mood, only pointed out that what is done out of love is "beyond good and evil," not that what is done out of a sense of necessity, or from feelings about what one's identity requires, is beyond good and evil.

The volume is not well served by its introduction, which spends twenty four pages summarizing the articles that follow. This has no real purpose in a collection of very densely argued papers, insofar as the summaries can make little sense to the reader at the outset. Why not use the introduction to lay out the terrain, explaining Williams's main theses and saying what has attracted and what deserves critical attention? Moving beyond this plaint, I heartily recommend this book as essential and stimulating reading for anyone interested in Bernard Williams, as everyone interested in contemporary moral philosophy ought to be, and commend the editor for putting together as well as contributing to a sophisticated and exciting collection.