Bertrand Russell and the Edwardian Philosophers: Constructing the World

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Omar Nasim, Bertrand Russell and the Edwardian Philosophers: Constructing the World, Palgrave Macmillan, 2008, 208pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230205796.

Reviewed by Bernard Linsky, University of Alberta



Omar Nasim brings to light a fascinating controversy over the problem of the external world that involved several prominent Edwardian philosophers including G. F. Stout, T. P. Nunn, and Samuel Alexander. Nasim’s account places Bertrand Russell’s “sense data” in the context of this debate and so makes sense of what Russell called the “problem of matter” as it emerged in his writings from the The Problems of Philosophy in 1912 until The Analysis of Matter in 1927.

Russell introduced sense data using familiar arguments from the relativity of perception. A table looks rectangular to one observer, and a different shape to another, or brown at some angles and white from others. The various patches of color or shapes are sense data, unlike the material table, which presumably has only one color and shape. In The Problems of Philosophy, Russell then answers George Berkeley’s famous rejection of matter, instead concluding that we know matter by inference as the cause of those sense data.

Nasim shows how in several papers, including “On Matter” which Russell wrote and presented twice in 1912, a different view emerged. (“On Matter” is now published in The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, Vol. 6). Russell began to argue that sense data are not mental objects, but are instead “physical”, that is, they occur in space, yet they are not material objects. What’s more, Russell came to accept the view that sense data, which he identified as the objects of perception, can nevertheless also exist unobserved, as “sensibilia”. Part of this change of views includes the replacement of the “postulation” of matter as the cause of sense data in perception by Russell’s famous method of “logical construction”, by which sense data arranged from certain perspectives constitute physical objects. Think, for example, of a penny seen from different distances and different angles. The sense data of a perceiver from different distances and angles can be organized into classes along “perspectives” (as the penny appears larger from closer up and round or elliptical from different angles). Material objects are then constructed as classes of these “perspectives” of sense data.

Russell’s view of sense data in this new phase, as not mental ideas, but rather as the objects of perception, while still not being material, is seen as an odd combination. In his history The Semantic Tradition from Kant to Carnap: To the Vienna Station, Alberto Coffa complains that sense data are just “reified” sensory “elements” such as colors and sounds, and the first step in a slide back to idealism in much Twentieth Century empiricism. J. L. Austin’s ridiculed sense data as objects of direct perception which are different from ordinary material objects in Sense and Sensibilia. The notion of “indirect” perception Austin says, is the one that “wears the pants”, and it is in fact quite useless. (Is seeing something through a periscope indirect, or in a mirror?) What Nasim proposes is that Russell should be viewed as responding to the views of his “Edwardian” contemporaries, rather than relapsing to the older British Empiricists, such as Locke and Berkeley who had a full blown “veil of ideas” to deal with in their theories of perception. Nasim argues that Stout was a precursor of the New Realists in that he distinguished perceptual acts from their objects, in the tradition of Brentano. Then, in response to Stout, the “New Realists”, in particular Nunn and Alexander, added that the objects of perception are not in the mind. Thus in 1910 we find Alexander saying that our “mental actions” relate us to physical objects, and that the appearances of those objects are themselves physical, but only partial and part of a “connected and continuous whole” with those physical objects.

Nasim finds throughout the papers containing the “Controversy” he brings to light the view that “sense data” (a term that the Edwardians picked up from Russell) are extra-mental and of a kind with material objects, somehow related to them. To spell out this relation, Nunn (in 1907) talks of material objects as a “secondary construction” from those appearances, but has little to say about the nature of “constructions”. Another issue that concerned Russell was raised by Nunn and Stout who debated over the problem of apparently locating contrary properties (being round and elliptical) in the same place in public space. Stout insisted that contrary properties could not be located in the same place, Nunn that this occurs frequently. Nasim thus shows how all of the ingredients of Russell’s “problem of matter” appear somewhere in the “Controversy”, and how Russell added his own distinctive notion of logical construction to this mix to resolve the issues. In particular Russell resolved the problem of conflicting properties at the same location by asserting that all sensations or experiences must be analyzed as “from” some percipient and “at” some material object. Thus six dimensions are needed, three to locate material objects from an observer (as specified in three dimensions) and three to where the perception is “at”. The dispute between Nunn and Stout is resolved by showing each to be only partially right. Stout is right that from the location of a given percipient one can only see consistent properties at a different location. So the penny has only a particular shape from a given perspective. But Nunn is right in so far as an object at a specific location can have different properties from different locations. From one place the penny at that location looks round, from another place, the very same penny at the same place looks elliptical. Russell then constructs the material penny from classes of all those appearances at a given location from all different perspectives. Russell also parts ways with some of his contemporary Edwardian New Realists on the issue of whether sense data exist unperceived, while agreeing that they are extra-mental. The idea of unobserved sense data, however, was not Russell’s invention, but is in fact explicitly endorsed by Stout. (Stout only rates as a “proto-new-realist” in Nasim’s classification of Edwardian views).

Thus Nasim argues that Russell took ideas that were being debated and made them precise to formulate his own views on sense data and matter. Most importantly, Russell replaced what Nasim describes as a “socio-psychological” notion of construction with the precise method of “logical construction” modeled on the construction of numbers as equivalence classes, which he brought to the “Controversy” from his work on logic and the foundations of mathematics. Both the origins of some of the unusual aspects of Russell’s theory of sense data as being non-mental, but also not material, are found in the Edwardian controversy. We also learn what new ideas Russell brought to the debate to make it his own and to come up with his distinctive project of constructing matter from sense data. Nasim does not want to assign priority for Russell’s ideas to his contemporaries, and indeed is focused on showing what a unique contribution the notion of logical construction was to clarifying the issues.

Nasim’s argument is persuasive, although he doesn’t go into enough detail of the views of these Edwardians to give a clear view of how their own positions hold together. He is content, for example, with identifying Stout simply as a “proto-new-realist” without ever explaining how the view compares with his British Idealist predecessors, nor does he give a description of Samuel Alexander’s views as a coherent system. This is disappointing, and suggests that these philosophers were really arguing within a different style and tradition from that of the newly emerging Analytic Philosophy of Moore and Russell. Nasim is not completely convincing in this presentation of the Edwardian New Realists as contributing thoughts that we find difficult in Russell, but not as having original or coherent systems of their own as rivals to what Russell later produced.

This can’t be the right view of Nasim’s Edwardian Philosophers. For one thing, there is in fact a very important connection between Alexander and the broad Australian stream in contemporary analytic philosophy. Alexander was himself an Australian, having grown up in Sydney and Melbourne before winning a scholarship at Oxford. While lecturing at the Universities of Glasgow and Edinburgh, the Scot John Anderson was impressed by Alexander’s later Gifford Lectures, Space, Time and Deity. Anderson emigrated in the other direction, to Australia in 1927, and went on to found the distinctive Sydney school of metaphysics, influencing a generation of students including David Armstrong and John Mackie. Alexander forms the link between the realism of Russell’s Logical Atomism period and before, and the recent flourishing of realist metaphysics in Australia. (The connection is well known to students of Anderson. Indeed notes of year long series of lectures that Anderson gave in 1944 on Alexander’s metaphysics are available online from the John Anderson Archive at the University of Sydney.) So Nasim’s Edwardian “Controversy” is more than an obscure episode in the history of Early Analytic Philosophy in Britain. Instead it is the originating source of the eventual resurgence of realist metaphysics that came out of Australasia in the 1970s and 1980s. It would have been nice if Nasim had gone into more details of Alexander’s views, to show their similarities with contemporary metaphysical ideas.

Nasim has made a valuable discovery by identifying the origins of Russell’s problem of constructing matter from sense data in the debates of his Edwardian contemporaries. Unfortunately Nasim’s presentation of this discovery has some deficiencies for which the reader should be prepared. The book began life as a doctoral thesis and still shows some signs of its origins. For example, it is only 170 pages in length, and is full of remarks about its limited focus. Nasim is content with showing the relevance of pieces of “the Debate”, as he calls it, to Russell’s later views. We don’t get a coherent account of the positions of the participants, including Alexander, who is so important for later views, or those of Stout, one of Russell’s teachers, who is only described as a “proto-new Realist”. Repeatedly Nasim declares that he will not enter into certain aspects of his subject “for reasons of space”, which reminds me of the sort of response of a student who rejects a supervisor’s request for more detail or explanation. Thus of the connection of Brentano and Moore, with both distinguishing the act of perception from its objects, we learn only:

In fact, I wish to claim that some of Moore’s works from this period was substantially influenced by the British Brentanian tradition, via Stout. Substantiating this claim, however, will take us too far a field, and so I shall merely assume it as a plausible claim. (p. 99)

Indeed we hear very little of Moore, who was in fact a participant in a famous symposium with Stout on “The Status of Sense-Data” (1914) in the Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, the meetings of the Society being the location of many episodes in the “Dispute”. Nothing at all is said about this “British Brentanian tradition” beyond the assignment of Stout as a member. From all that we read of selections from Stout, he appears to be a British Idealist who makes a distinction between mental acts and their objects, arguing that objects are just part of a larger whole, indeed, as the idealist monists Bernard Bosanquet or F. H. Bradley themselves might have done. Nasim restricts himself to arguing that Russell’s views have origins in the ideas of his “New Realist” contemporaries. Yet, the move from the preceding idealist metaphysics to the new Realism seems as relevant to an understanding of the origins of Early Analytic Philosophy as what Nasim does discuss.

Still, Nasim’s book certainly fulfills the purpose of the History of Analytic Philosophy series in which it is published. Bertrand Russell and the Edwardian Philosophers will be essential reading for those interested in this period of Russell’s thought and the larger history of analytic philosophy, even though it only tells a part of the story.