Bertrand Russell and the Nature of Propositions: A History and Defense of the Multiple Relation Theory of Judgement

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Samuel Lebens, Bertrand Russell and the Nature of Propositions: A History and Defense of the Multiple Relation Theory of Judgement, Routledge, 2017, 296 pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138737457.

Reviewed by Peter Hanks, University of Minnesota


Russell's multiple relation theory of judgment is the view that judgment is a non-binary, polyadic relation between a subject and various objects, properties, or relations. The contrast here is with a dual relation theory of judgment, on which judgment is a two-place relation between a subject and a proposition. Suppose Ivanka judges that Donald loves Melania. The two views differ as follows:

Judges (Ivanka, Donald, love, Melania)                      multiple relation theory

Judges (Ivanka, that Donald loves Melania)               dual relation theory

Russell endorsed the dual relation theory up until around 1906, at which point he began to waver. He adopted the multiple relation theory in 1910 and held onto it until 1919. Famously, his confidence in the theory was shaken by Wittgenstein in 1913.

Samuel Lebens' book is a lively and full-throated defense of the multiple relation theory. He offers it not only as an account of judgment but also as a theory of propositions. He calls it a "no-propositions theory of propositions". He thinks the multiple relation theory can solve all of the problems and explain everything that needs explaining in current debates about the metaphysics of propositions -- and can do so without positing propositions.

As the subtitle indicates, the book also aims to chart the history of the multiple relation theory. Russell formulated a number of different versions of the theory in response to his own concerns and to pressure from others, including G.F. Stout and Wittgenstein. The problems that Russell was responding to and his strategies for solving them are all topics of active interest and debate. In fact, the literature on this topic has become rather tortuous. Lebens does a really commendable job of navigating through this literature. His book is the best attempt I have seen at a comprehensive historical study of the multiple relation theory.

The interpretive issues that Lebens takes up are not limited to Russell's theory of judgment. Russell's theory of descriptions also comes in for extended discussion. In chapter 4, Lebens defends the surprising claim that Russell's "theory of descriptions, and his account of names, actually has nothing to do with semantics" (p.59). His argument turns on a distinction between an expression's compositional semantic value and its assertoric content. He argues that Russell's views about descriptions should be taken to concern the latter, i.e. that the theory of descriptions is really about the propositions that speakers assert with sentences containing descriptions, not about the semantics of these expressions. There's a danger of anachronism in reading this distinction back into Russell's views in 1905, but Lebens does a nice job of defending this revisionary reading of the theory of descriptions.

The historical parts of the book are well argued and illuminating, but these issues are not Lebens' main concern. His primary aim is to revitalize the multiple relation theory and make it a contender in contemporary debates about the nature of propositions. His strategy is two-fold: (i) he argues that the multiple relation theory can overcome all of the problems that have been leveled against it, and (ii) he attempts to show that the multiple relation theory can give us everything we want from a theory of propositions. For reasons of space I am going to focus on (i), and in particular on just one of the problems for the multiple relation theory, a problem that Lebens credits to Stout, which he calls the "representation-concern". There are other important problems for the multiple relation theory. For example, there are a number of constraints on a theory of judgment that Lebens finds in Wittgenstein's criticisms, including what he calls the "significance constraint". There is also the problem of molecular judgments, i.e. judgments of negations, conjunctions, and so on, as well as quantified judgments, which Lebens tackles in chapter 9. However, it's fair to say that Lebens regards the representation-concern as the most pressing problem. He argues that "Stout's concern is just more fundamental than many of the concerns attributed to Wittgenstein," and he thinks that "to solve Stout's concern is to solve the significance concern in its wake," (p.179). Let's therefore focus on the representation-concern.

On its first appearance, the representation-concern is about propositions. As Lebens explains, "the problem is how to account for the curious ability of propositions to represent, all by themselves," (p.9). But, of course, this can't be the problem for the multiple relation theory, since that theory does away with propositions. What is the representation-concern for the multiple relation theory of judgment?

The problem came into focus for me only when I got to Lebens' solution in chapter 8. Lebens provides an account, based on the multiple relation theory, of how a subject manages to represent the world in making a judgment. His striking idea is that subjects use objects as representations of themselves, and they use properties and relations as predicates of those objects. For example, in judging that Donald loves Melania, Ivanka uses Donald to represent himself and Melania to represent herself. She then uses the relation of loving as a predicate, applying it to Donald and Melania in that order, with the result that the judgment is true just in case Donald loves Melania.

Lebens fills this out by offering an "axiomatic theory of predication in judgment" (p.185). The theory is an adaptation of a strategy due to Davidson (2005), which came to Lebens by way of Mark Sainsbury (1996). A Davidsonian truth theory includes an axiom for every predicate that specifies the truth-conditions for sentences that result from concatenating that predicate with singular terms. Similarly, a Sainsbury-Lebens theory of predication includes an axiom for every property or relation that specifies the truth-conditions of the judgments that result from predicative applications of that property or relation to objects. For example, the axiom for the love relation says: "the relation of love is such that it can only be used predicatively of two further object-terms, and will generate a judgment that is true iff the first of the two loves the second," (p.184). The theory includes a corresponding axiom for every property or relation. The result is a theory that can explain, for every (atomic) judgment, why that judgment has the truth-conditions that it has. The explanation is not general, insofar as we have to appeal to a separate axiom for each property or relation. Nevertheless, Lebens thinks that the theory is enough to explain how representation occurs in judgments. This is his solution to the representation-concern, which, as should now be clear, is the problem of explaining how we represent the world in making judgments.

The idea that in judgment we deploy a Lagadonian language in which objects are used to represent themselves is, I think, the most provocative claim in the book. Why not say instead that judgment involves mental representations for objects and properties, and that predication is a matter of combining these representations in thought? Because Lebens wants to preserve a thesis he calls "direct realism", the "doctrine that a proposition contains the very entities that it is about and/or invokes as its constituents" (p.34). But note that this is a thesis about content. It is the thesis that the content of a thought contains the very entities that the thought is about. On the multiple relation theory, the "contents" of a judgment must be the entities to which the subject is related by the judgment relation. Direct realism about judgment therefore requires that the relata of the judgment relation include objects themselves. Mental representations pose no threat to this thesis. The fact that I use a mental representation to think about or refer to an object does not entail that the content of my thought contains something other than that object. Consider the use of a directly referential singular term to refer to an object. The content of the utterance includes the object itself, even though a linguistic expression was used in its performance. Similarly, the content of a judgment can include an object even though the subject deployed a mental representation in forming the judgment.

At one point Lebens remarks that "the fundamental motivation for direct realism is the desire to put our minds in contact with the world without any intermediary veils" (p.110). But the veil metaphor is at home in debates about perception and sense data, not in debates about content. Mental or linguistic representations do not constitute a veil that comes between us and things in the world. The only threat to "direct realism" from mental or linguistic representations comes from thinking that the contents of these representations are not worldly objects and relations. I worry that Lebens has confused issues about direct reference in the philosophy of language with very different considerations from the philosophy of perception.

If I am right, then Lebens ought to drop the Lagadonian language idea and replace it with the more familiar view that judgment employs mental representations. That's a fairly easy fix, which I think would make his view more appealing to more philosophers. But there is a more fundamental problem for the multiple relation theory, which to my mind is fatal for this account of judgment. (I happen to think that this problem goes to the heart of the objections that Wittgenstein posed for Russell, but I won't press that point here.) The problem, in a nutshell, is that our concepts of judgment, belief, and assertion are concepts of relations to truth-bearers. Judgment, by its nature, is a relation to something for which the question of truth or falsity can arise.

The point can be illustrated in a number of ways. Any judgment can be recast as a judgment that something is true. If Ivanka judged that Donald loves Melania, then she judged that it is true that Donald loves Melania. The two judgments are, if not identical, then concomitant and interchangeable. So, whenever you judge something, what you judge, i.e. that to which you are related by judgment, must be the sort of thing that can be true or false. Note in addition that the verbs 'judge', 'believe' and 'assert' all take sentential complements, the contents of which are true or false. This is not an accident of language. It reflects something important about our concepts of these attitudes. As Wittgenstein put it in "Notes on Logic," "ordinary language would not contain the whole propositions if it did not need them," (Wittgenstein 1979, p.101). Consider the related case of sentential negation, i.e. 'it is not the case that' (an example that Wittgenstein uses). The kind of negation expressed by 'it is not the case that' operates on truth-bearers: it takes in something true or false and delivers something with the opposite truth-value. Sentential negation, by nature, applies to things that are true or false. Judgment, belief, and assertion are exactly analogous.

The problem for the multiple relation theory of judgment should be clear. The truth-bearers to which we are related by judgment are propositions. Judgment has to be a dual relation to a proposition. A plurality of objects and a relation, even an ordered plurality, is not true or false. Indeed, it's not even one thing, but rather many things. You cannot be related by judgment to such a plurality. By analyzing judgment in this way, the multiple relation theory is guilty of a category mistake. It is no more possible to bear the judgment relation to an ordered many than it is to negate a pair of objects and a relation.

Perhaps out of sensitivity to this issue, Lebens suggests that an ordered plural, or "vector", can be true or false, albeit in derivative sense: "I call a vector true when it, and the world, are such that if anyone judges that vector, they judge truly," (p.116). The problem is that there is no "it" in the case of an ordered plural -- there's no single thing that can be a truth-bearer. Furthermore, if we treat a vector as a single entity, which can be true or false, and which serves as an argument to the judgment relation, then it looks like we're back to propositions and a dual relation theory of judgment.

There are moments in the book when it looks as though Lebens is not in fact offering a multiple relation theory of judgment at all. For example, he often describes his view as "a theory of predication for judgment," (p.184, my italics). Perhaps he is really giving us a theory of predication -- a theory of what goes on in an act of predication, and how these acts have truth-conditions. The concept of predication is importantly different from the concepts of judgment, belief, and assertion, and there is no corresponding pressure to regard predication as a relation to a truth-bearer. We predicate properties and relations of objects, and that looks on the surface to involve a multiple relation. Similarly, the verb 'to predicate' does not take sentential complements (at least, not that-clauses). Unlike the case of judgment, a multiple relation theory of predication looks quite natural. But that doesn't change the fact that we need propositions to be the relata of judgment, belief, and assertion. Lebens deserves credit for his effort to defend Russell's multiple relation theory. The theory is important and worth preserving, but not as a theory of judgment and not as means of doing away with propositions.


Thanks to Samuel Lebens for helpful comments on an earlier draft.


Davidson, Donald. 2005. Truth and Predication. Harvard University Press.

Sainsbury, Mark. 1996. "How Can we Mean Something." In Bertrand Russell and the Origin of Analytic Philosophy, edited by R. Monk and A. Palmer. Thoemmes Press, pp.137-53.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1979. Notebooks 1914-1916. 2nd edition. University of Chicago Press.