Bertrand Russell, Language and Linguistic Theory

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Keith Green, Bertrand Russell, Language and Linguistic Theory, Continuum, 2007, 174pp., $144.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826497369.

Reviewed by Bernard Linsky, University of Alberta


This book surveys Russell's writing on language, from the theory of descriptions in "On Denoting" (1905) to An Inquiry into Meaning and Truth (1940) and on to his work in the 1950s. The focus is on familiar aspects of Russell's philosophy, which have already had a great influence on linguists interested in semantics: Russell's theory of descriptions, his views on proper names and vagueness, etc. A final chapter claims that Russell is a "major figure in literary modernism" and relates Russell to T.S. Eliot and D.H. Lawrence, who were involved with the Bloomsbury circle that Russell frequented.

This book has five chapters. A first (summary) chapter, called "Contexts and connexions", is almost entirely devoted to Russell, but also says a bit about the state of linguistics in the early part of the twentieth century. Much of Green's interest in the book is really devoted to the work of Wittgenstein and the Ordinary Language philosophers of the post World War II years. As an indication of what the reader can expect: Green quotes the paragraph from Augustine's Confessions that begins Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations in Latin; he doesn’t give the paragraph’s translation (which Wittgenstein provided in a footnote). The point of the reference and digression, which can only be followed by readers of Latin, is that Russell's view of language is based on the word/world relationship of naming in contrast with Saussure’s view that language is composed of a system of arbitrary, interrelated signs. This would be of interest to philosophers familiar with Russell if in fact Green had more to say about Saussure. Instead there is simply one reference in the bibliography, and none at all for the Philosophical Investigations, although the quoted passage concludes with a citation: "(Wittgenstein 1953: 2)".

Anyone looking for details of how linguists view particular topics that interested Russell, such as vagueness or definite descriptions, should go directly to James McCawley's Everything That Linguists Have Always Wanted to Know About Logic, rather than Green's reports of his views. Green is unsure on formal matters, or was perhaps unable to proof read the book, as I counted errors in ten of the dozen or so symbolic formulae. In addition, Green’s book is full of quotations that are not supported by entries in the bibliography: "Wood, 1957: 198", "Wittgenstein (1961a [1914]: 107)", "Russell (1928:11)", "Wittgenstein 1995: 325". My Philosophical Development is cited as published in 1959 and 1958 in different places. The citations are sparser on the linguistics side. Green claims that philosophers were ignorant of work in linguistics:

The American tradition rarely looked to Europe for inspiration, and just as the philosophers had ignored the works of Von Humboldt, Saussure and Bloomfield among many others in the first half of the twentieth century, so the American descriptivists ignored the work of Trubetzkoy and Hjelmslev in the post-war era. (p. 123)

Of these linguists only Bloomfield and Saussure appear in the bibliography, with one work each. The citations are incomplete (Bloomfield's "(1933) Language" and "Saussure, F. de (1983) Cours de linguistique generale. Trans. Roy Harris London: Duckworth"), but make it possible to find the books. There is no way to use the book as a guide to reading the material relevant either to Russell's or the linguists’ work.

The second chapter is called "Language and the world" and discusses "On Denoting" and Russell's account of indexicals, "egocentric particulars". Here the role of individual referring expressions such as "logically proper names" is contrasted with the somewhat holistic account of meaning that emerges from the contextual definitions of definite descriptions. The discussion of indexicals emphasizes the distinction now made between pragmatics and semantics in discussion of deictic expressions. These are interesting topics, but already discussed elsewhere.

Chapter 3, "Language and the mind", discusses Russell's theory of ordinary proper names and his evolving theories of propositions. Again, this is familiar territory, and Green doesn't advance the understanding that is already in the literature. Chapter 4, "Language and linguistic theory", promises to be about linguistics. Instead the discussion is of Russell's relationship to Wittgenstein and Ordinary Language Philosophy. Russell's attack on ordinary language as vague and misleading is charged with confusing the making of ordinary language the central focus of investigation with the use of ordinary language in the analysis and description of philosophical questions (p. 140). Until Richard Montague published "English as formal language" (1970), philosophers thought that symbolic logic was a better way to express the logical form of sentences than leaving them as they stand. They also thought that they needed to use technical terminology and develop theories, rather than describe phenomena in ordinary language. Russell may have been wrong on the first point, but it is not clear that this was a result of confusion rather than of pessimism about the possibility of reading the logical form of ordinary language expressions off their surface syntax.

The fifth and final chapter ("'These fragments I have shored against my ruins': Russell and Modernism") focuses on Russell's relationships with T.S. Eliot and D.H. Lawrence, and a bit on Russell's prose style "in order to demonstrate that Russell is a key figure in modernism" (p. 144). Green gives Eliot the most attention, focusing on the interaction between Russell and Eliot while they were at Harvard in 1914. Green makes much of the use, by both Russell and Eliot, of the image of a gas flame flickering, hinting that Eliot took it from Russell (p. 152). Unfortunately the reference to Russell is to an unidentifiable "(1984: 6)", another error with the system of citations.

Again "On Denoting" comes up, as an example of modernist thinking, with its search for underlying truths. We are then treated to a "deconstruction" of Russell's theory of descriptions, to illustrate the change from modernism to postmodernism:

What Russell wanted to do with the Theory of Descriptions was to create an analytical framework by which a fragment of language would be shorn of its ontologically misleading function. Language is thus set in opposition to truth or reality, and analysis becomes the tool for making one fit the other, more precisely making language fit for the world it must represent. Yet the reality that Russell wishes to represent is only done so at the expense of a multiplication of the very elements he wishes to minimize. What lies beneath each singular term is not truth or reality, but an ever more complex series of language elements. (pp. 146-147)

There are surely valuable things to say about Russell's relationship with the British modernist writers with which he associated. As well, it is certainly appropriate to take Russell himself seriously as a writer. He did, after all, get a Nobel Prize in Literature in 1950. There is also surely something of interest in the fact that while philosophers in the 1950s and early 1960s were moved by ordinary language philosophy and Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations to move away from the use of symbolic logic in their work, it was in 1957 that Chomsky's Syntactic Structures moved a large number of linguists to the very study of formal languages and syntactic form that was brought back into philosophy by Montague. Philosophers have a stake in the question of the nature of Russell's views on language because of the account of analytic philosophy given by Michael Dummett in his Origins of Analytic Philosophy (1994). Dummett says that analytic philosophy is characterized by the thesis that a "philosophical account" of thought is possible only through a study of language. To the extent that Russell was concerned with the analysis of propositions independently of their linguistic expression, and then of facts and the logical structure of the world, he comes to be defined out of the school altogether, leaving Frege and Wittgenstein as its founders. On the other hand, it does seem that it was Wittgenstein in the Tractatus, and then later Gilbert Ryle, in "Systematically Misleading Expressions", who suggested that it was Russell's theory of descriptions that introduced the project of philosophy as overcoming the misleading analyses of propositions that are suggested by their surface syntax and apparent logical form. It is also important for Russell scholars to figure out the significance of some of Russell's later writings, such as his paper "Is Mathematics Purely Linguistic?" from 1950 (to be found in volume 11 of The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell). Russell seems to concede much to the view that logic is a matter of language, a view which had emerged out of Wittgenstein's Tractatus and the Vienna Circle and which he had resisted for many years. Some recently have argued that even the early work of Principia Mathematica treated propositional functions as linguistic, so this is an important issue for Russell scholars. A book that deals with these questions has yet to be written.