Best Explanations: New Essays on Inference to the Best Explanation

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Kevin McCain and Ted Poston (eds.), Best Explanations: New Essays on Inference to the Best Explanation, Oxford University Press, 2017, 288pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198746904.

Reviewed by Finnur Dellsén, Inland Norway University of Applied Sciences


Inference to the Best Explanation (IBE) is supposed to be a rule of inference according to which one infers a theory that would, if true, provide the best available explanation for one's evidence. Many philosophers believe that this describes a paradigm of cogent non-deductive inference rules; indeed, it's becoming increasingly common for philosophers to claim that all cogent non-deductive inferences are, or ultimately reduce to, inferences to the best explanation. Interestingly, this idea is probably least popular within the very subfield of philosophy where IBE has been studied most extensively, viz. philosophy of science. In other areas of our field, the phrase "Inference to the Best Explanation" appears too often to be invoked to use a rather ambiguous set of considerations to support a favored philosophical theory, with only the weakest signs of awareness of the very considerable difficulties involved in justifying, applying or even formulating IBE.

This collection assembled by Kevin McCain and Ted Poston will, one hopes, go some way towards rectifying this. It contains sixteen original articles by some of the leading contributors to debates about IBE and by various epistemologists whose interests intersect with IBE in various ways. This is not an introductory book -- nor is it intended to be -- so students who are seeking an accessible guide to recent debates about IBE will have to look elsewhere. It is, however, a highly valuable resource for researchers, especially those whose interests lie primarily within epistemology, who will find here many excellent contributions to debates about the nature and epistemic status of IBE. In particular, this volume will be essential reading for those interested in (i) how IBE can or should be formulated within a broadly-speaking Bayesian framework for non-deductive reasoning, (ii) whether IBE is a fundamental or derivative form of inference, and (iii) whether IBE is, or can be shown to be, a justified, reliable or rational form of inference.

I have only two mildly critical remarks about the composition of the volume. First, those looking for discussions of IBE grounded in scientific practice -- i.e., that really engage any specific scientific examples or concerns -- will find regrettably little to satisfy them. (A noteworthy exception is Leah Henderson's excellent contribution, which discusses the case of individual and group selection in evolutionary biology.) Second, some of the contributions seem to me to have a rather weak connection to the topic of IBE. For example, Timothy McGrew's "The Spirit of Cromwell's Rule" discusses arguments in favor of assigning only non-extreme subjective probabilities to hypotheses not entailed by one's total evidence, but makes no substantive connection with IBE or explanatory reasoning more generally. In some of the other papers, IBE is frequently referred to, but it was not clear (to this reviewer at any rate) that the discussion applied specifically to IBE as opposed to any other form of non-deductive reasoning. This lack of focus on the finer details of IBE specifically may sometimes be frustrating to those readers who are looking for papers devoted to this particular inference rule.

I turn now to a brief overview of some of the volume's sixteen papers, focusing on the issues (i)-(iii) that are, in my view, most thoroughly explored in its various essays. A number of the contributions concern the issue of how, if at all, IBE can be incorporated into a Bayesian framework for non-deductive reasoning. Ever since van Fraassen's (1989) influential critique of IBE, there have been a number of proposals for how IBE, or explanatory considerations more generally, should be incorporated into such a probabilistic framework. According to van Fraassen's conception of Bayesian IBE, hypotheses that provide better explanations of the evidence on which one is updating get assigned a higher probability than their prior conditional probability given the evidence. Since this means that Bayesian IBE would violate Bayesian conditionalization, most authors reject van Fraassen's conception of what a Bayesian IBE would amount to. However, Igor Douven, in "Inference to the Best Explanation: What Is It? And Why Should We Care?", outlines a case for nevertheless adopting van Fraassen's conception of a Bayesian IBE and using it to replace rather than supplement Bayesian conditionalization. In particular, Douven uses computer simulations to argue that certain versions of van Fraassen-style Bayesian IBE outperform ordinary Bayesian conditionalization in particular situations with respect to how fast these updating rules get us to believe the truth. Douven's paper is remarkably accessible given its technical nature, contains useful summaries of his previous work on the topic (Douven 2013, 2017), and, furthermore, extends this work to different measures of explanatory goodness.

Jonah Schupbach, in "Inference to the Best Explanation, Cleaned Up and Made Respectable", is also concerned with finding a place for IBE within a Bayesian framework. In contrast to Douven, Schupbach argues that an important part of IBE, viz. the virtue of explanatory power, can be identified in the very subjective probabilities that any Bayesian already recognizes as epistemically relevant. For Schupbach, IBE is thus not something that needs to be added to the Bayesian framework after the fact, but rather something that is already contained within it. Specifically, Schupbach presents and motivates a precise probabilistic measure of explanatory power based on conditional probabilities of the relevant hypothesis given the evidence, and given the negation of that evidence.[1] This measure turns out to entail that one hypothesis H1 has greater explanatory power than another H2, relative to some evidence E, if and only if the likelihood of E is greater on H1 than on H2 (i.e., Pr(E|H1) ˃ Pr(E|H2)). Although the idea that IBE can partly be identified with relative likelihoods in this way is familiar and widely endorsed (e.g., Okasha 2000; Dellsén 2018), Schupbach's route to this conclusion is certainly novel and worth further study.

Alexander Bird's "Inference to the Best Explanation, Bayesianism, and Knowledge" advocates a somewhat similar conciliatory position regarding the relationship between IBE and Bayesianism, albeit with an objectivist twist. On Bird's view, the explanatory virtues that jointly determine the overall explanatory goodness of a hypothesis can be separated into 'internal' and 'external' virtues -- where the former concern the nature of the hypothesis itself and the latter concern the hypothesis' explanatory relationship with the relevant evidence. Bird suggests that internal virtues determine the prior of the hypothesis, i.e. Pr(H), while external virtues determine the ratio of likelihood of the evidence on the hypothesis to the expectedness of the evidence by itself, i.e. Pr(E|H)/Pr(E).[2] Importantly, however, the probabilities that Bird sees as determined by these virtues are given a non-standard interpretation: they are not degrees of rational belief, but degrees of objective plausibility. Bird associates these 'plausibilities' with Williamson's (2000) notion of 'evidential probability', but it remains unclear, at least to me, why Bird's 'plausibilities' should satisfy the probability axioms -- and thus be construed as an interpretation of probability in the first place.[3]

A fourth and final paper on the relationship between IBE and Bayesianism is Leah Henderson's "Bayesianism and IBE: The Case of Individual vs. Group Selection". Henderson outlines her 'emergent compatibilism' (see Henderson 2014) according to which the conclusions that would be licensed by IBE are automatically obtained in a Bayesian framework, given certain natural assumptions about distributions of prior probabilities. The key idea here is that scientific theories form 'hierarchies', with some more specific theories being obtained from more general ones by specifying the values of various parameters, or by adding specific auxiliary hypotheses. According to Henderson, theories that provide better explanations are those whose parameters or auxiliaries do not need to be 'fine-tuned' to the same extent in order for the theories to provide explanations of the relevant evidence. Henderson shows that, given natural priors, this means that theories that provide better explanations in this sense are also more probable. In the present paper, Henderson also argues convincingly that this accounts for the way in which simplicity, and explanatory considerations more generally, have been invoked to argue against the existence of group selection in evolutionary biology. She further argues that her account shows that simplicity need not be thought of as a highly case-specific type of theoretical virtue with no general characterization or function (as Sober (1990) influentially argued). Henderson's paper is convincing, innovative, tightly argued, and grounded in scientific practice; it deserves to be very widely read.

Having discussed four papers that concern the relationship between IBE and Bayesianism,[4] I turn now to the related issue of whether IBE is a fundamental or reducible type of non-deductive inference.[5] Richard Fumerton's "Reasoning to the Best Explanation" argues that IBE is reducible to 'inductive reasoning' (by which he seems to mean what many others call 'enumerative induction'). On Fumerton's view, whenever we are in position to infer an explanatory hypothesis from some evidence, it is because our previous experience contains a correlation between the truth of that kind of hypothesis and the relevant type of evidence. For example, if we can infer that lightning caused the fire that started around the time we heard thunder, it is only because the occurrence of lightning has previously been correlated with fire and thunder in our experiences until now. So far so good, but Fumerton's position is subject to a well-known objection: for many apparently quite legitimate scientific inferences, the inferred hypothesis concerns wholly unobservable (or simply unobserved) kinds of entities for which there clearly are no correlations of the relevant sort.[6] For example, gravitational waves are nowhere to be seen; we know them only through their effects. Fumerton does not address this objection, nor does he engage with a number of very prominent arguments along these lines, e.g. Harman (1965) and Weintraub (2013). This is especially unfortunate since Weintraub, in her contribution to this very volume (more on which below), explicitly refers to and convincingly criticizes Fumerton's position on this issue (pp. 190-192).

Kareem Khalifa, Jared Millson, and Mark Risjord (henceforth KMR) also argue for reductionism about IBE in their "Inference to the Best Explanation: Fundamentalism's Failures". However, KMR's reduction takes a very different form than Fumerton's. Roughly, KMR's central thesis is that IBE can be reduced to other kinds of non-deductive inferences in which one appeals to a set of 'thick bundles' of different types of explanations and their associated explanatory virtues. So, for example, when we infer that the driver hit the tree because he was drunk, we might be tempted to say that this is licensed by the fact that drunkenness would best explain the crash; but really what is going on is that we are appealing to a specific explanatory relation, viz. causality in this case, and its associated explanatory virtues, e.g. simplicity and explanatory power. That is, we infer that drunkenness is the simplest and explanatorily most powerful cause of the crash. The obvious problem with this proposal -- recognized by KMR -- is of course that it is not immediately clear that it amounts to reduction, as opposed to an explication, of IBE. KMR's main argument for this being a reduction appears to appeal to an example in which we infer that a house was in an oxygenated atmosphere from the fact that it caught fire. According to KMR, this inference cannot be described as an instance of IBE, since being in an oxygenated atmosphere intuitively does not 'best explain' the fire. However, it seems to me that this inference could easily (and would normally) be described as a case in which being in an oxygenated atmosphere is part of -- or, equivalently, entailed by -- the best explanation of the fire.[7] This matters because much of the canonical literature concerning IBE (e.g., Harman 1965) explicitly or implicitly assumes that IBE sanctions inferences in which the inferred hypothesis H is merely part of, or entailed by, the best explanation for the evidence E (see Dellsén 2016).

The final general topic of the volume I will discuss here concerns the epistemic status of IBE, i.e. roughly the question of whether IBE is justified, rational, or reliable. J. Adam Carter and Duncan Pritchard's "Inference to the Best Explanation and Epistemic Circularity" discusses what a justification for IBE would have to be like in order for it not to be objectionably circular. To this end, they distinguish two different kinds of rule-circularity: an argument is narrowly rule-circular when it employs the very same inference rule that the argument is meant to justify; by contrast, an argument is widely rule-circular when it employs an inference rule from the same 'epistemic framework' as the one it is meant to justify. Carter and Pritchard then suggest that even a widely rule-circular argument for IBE -- e.g., one that employs enumerative induction to justify IBE -- might be epistemically problematic, roughly since the ground one had for doubting IBE might also be a ground for doubting enumerative induction.[8] I found this latter point unconvincing, for there are well-known grounds for doubting IBE specifically that do not apply to other types of non-deductive inference (including enumerative induction), such as the objection that the 'best' available explanation might merely be the best of a bad lot (van Fraassen 1989; Dellsén 2017b).

Indeed, some of these grounds for doubting IBE specifically are discussed in Ruth Weintraub's "Skepticism about Inference to the Best Explanation". Weintraub considers five different arguments for thinking that IBE is not a cogent inference rule, and suggests that only two of these have analogues for enumerative induction. The three remaining arguments all concern the fact that IBE asks us to infer to the best available explanation. Roughly, the idea is that IBE thus implicitly assumes that the best available explanation is also the best possible explanation; but this assumption is arguably often (a) unjustified, (b) unreliable, and/or (c) historically unmotivated. Weintraub's paper does not exactly break new ground with regard to these objections, but she provides a useful categorization of various objections to IBE and their analogues (or lack thereof) for enumerative induction. Weintraub's provocative conclusion is that IBE "may be in a worse position than [enumerative] induction, because there are arguments that target it which do not have inductive analogues, and the converse isn't true" (p. 188). As noted above, Weintraub also argues persuasively against attempts to eliminate IBE or reduce it to other kinds of non-deductive inference, including that of Fumerton (1980).

A final paper on the epistemic status of IBE is Ali Hasan's "In Defense of Rationalism about Abductive Inference". Hasan argues that abductive inference is justifiable a priori -- or, more specifically, via a kind of direct awareness of objective epistemic probabilities. Going very much against the grain in contemporary epistemology, Hasan thus suggests to give probabilities a Keynesian, or 'logical', interpretation on which they measure objective degrees of inductive support. There are many well-known problems with such an interpretation, especially when coupled with the idea that these probabilities can be discovered by a priori insight. One of these, due to Ramsey (1931), is that most of us simply do not seem to have the required awareness of the values of these probabilities, except perhaps in very special cases (e.g. in the case of hypotheses entailed by our evidence). Hasan meets this Ramseyan challenge head on and argues extensively that we do have an awareness of the values of these probabilities in many cases. In the remaining cases, Hasan suggests that the Keynesian can simply deny that there are any probability relations at all between the relevant propositions and our evidence. However, this last move seems to me to be a mistake, since a 'probability relation' of this kind would simply not satisfy the formal features for something to be a probability function over the relevant propositions.[9] Thus 'Keynesian probability', developed in this way, would not really be an interpretation of the relevant mathematical notion of probability at all.

Best Explanations contains several other interesting papers that I can mention only very briefly -- some of which deserve to be widely read and discussed. For example, Elizabeth Fricker's "Inference to the Best Explanation and the Receipt of Testimony: Testimonial Reductionism Vindicated" provides a clear, accessible and yet very sophisticated defense of a form of IBE-based reductionism about testimonial justification. Fricker's paper will be essential reading for anyone interested in the epistemology of testimony. Another example is Cheryl Misak's "Peirce and Ramsey: Truth, Pragmatism, and Inference to the Best Explanation", which will no doubt be of great interest to scholars of Peirce and Ramsey, and those interested in the intellectual roots of IBE. Finally, those interested in the role of IBE in debates about external world skepticism will find two interesting and provocative papers on the topic in James Beebe's "Does Skepticism Presuppose Explanationism?" and Susanna Rinard's "External World Skepticism and Inference to the Best Explanation".


I am grateful to Kevin McCain and Ted Poston for helpful feedback.


Dellsén, F. 2016. Explanatory Rivals and the Ultimate Argument. Theoria 82: 217-237.

Dellsén, F. 2017a. Abductively Robust Inference. Analysis 77: 20-29.

Dellsén, F. 2017b. Reactionary Responses to the Bad Lot Objection. Studies in History and Philosophy of Science 61: 32-40.

Dellsén, F. 2018. The Heuristic Conception of Inference to the Best Explanation. Philosophical Studies 175: 1745-1766.

Douven, I. 1999. Inference to the Best Explanation Made Coherent. Philosophy of Science 66: S424-35.

Douven, I. 2013. Inference to the Best Explanation, Dutch Books, and Inaccuracy Minimization. Philosophical Quarterly 69: 428-44.

Fumerton, R. 1980. Induction and Reasoning to the Best Explanation. Philosophy of Science 47: 589-600.

Harman, G. 1965. The Inference to the best explanation. Philosophical Review 74: 88-95.

Henderson, L. 2014. Bayesianism and Inference to the Best Explanation. The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 65: 687-715.

Kaplan, M. 2009. Williamson's Causal Approach to Probabilism. In D. Pritchard and P. Greenough (eds.), Williamson on Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 122-139.

Okasha, S. 2000. Van Fraassen's Critique of Inference to the Best Explanation. Studies in History and Philosophy of Science 31: 691-710.

Ramsey, F. P. 1931. Truth and Probability. In R. B. Braithwaite (ed.), Foundations of Mathematics and other Logical Essays. London: Kegan, Paul, Trench, Trubner & Co., pp. 156-198.

Schupbach, J. N. 2011. Comparing Probabilistic Measures of Explanatory Power. Philosophy of Science 78: 813-29.

Schupbach, J. N. and J. Sprenger. 2011. The Logic of Explanatory Power. Philosophy of Science 78: 105-27.

Sober, E. 1990. Let's Razor Ockham's Razor. In D. Knowles (ed), Explanation and Its Limits. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 73-93.

van Fraassen, B. C. 1989. Laws and Symmetry. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Weintraub, R. 2013. Induction and Inference to the Best Explanation. Philosophical Studies 166: 203-216.

Williamson, T. 2000. Knowledge and Its Limits. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[1] This measure builds on previous work by Schupbach and others – see especially Schupbach (2011) and Schupbach and Sprenger (2011).

[2] The latter comes to much the same thing as Schupbach’s explanatory power, since the expectedness of the evidence, P(E), cancels out in a comparison of two hypotheses’ external virtues relative to the same evidence.

[3] A similar criticism applies to Williamson’s ‘evidential probability’ (Kaplan 2009).

[4] The topic of IBE and Bayesianism is also discussed in two contributions that I lack the space to discuss further here: Kevin McCain and Ted Poston’s “The Evidential Impact of Explanatory Considerations” and William Roche’s “Explanation, Confirmation, and Hempel’s Paradox”.

[5] This topic is related to the previous one in so far as one way in which IBE could fail to be fundamental is if it could be reduced to some part of the Bayesian framework.

[6] Indeed, Fumerton’s paper is a good example of why discussions of IBE would often benefit from a greater engagement with actual scientific inferences.

[7] Indeed, it seems to me that any half-decent explanation of the fire would entail that the house was in an oxygenated atmosphere, which arguably makes this an especially strong form of abductive inference (Dellsén 2017a).

[8] Although Carter and Pritchard do not say so explicitly, I assume they mean that the ground for doubting IBE would necessarily be a ground for doubting enumerative induction. After all, any two rules such that there are grounds for doubting each one will have a common ground – e.g., the conjunction of the two previous grounds – that will serve as a ground for doubting both.

[9] For example, the relevant function would seem to violate the first Kolmogorov axiom, according to which the probability of any such proposition is a non-negative number. Of course, one could restrict the quantifier in the axiom so as to exclude the relevant probability-less propositions, but then one would need a precise account of which propositions are excluded, and why.