Better Never to Have Been: The Harm of Coming into Existence

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David Benatar, Better Never to Have Been: The Harm of Coming into Existence, Oxford University Press, 2006, 238pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199296421

Reviewed by Christopher Belshaw, The Open University


This year's winner of the Bookseller/Diagram prize for the oddest title of the year is Stray Shopping Carts of Eastern North America: A Guide to Field Identification. Other finalists included How Green were the Nazis?, Tatooed Mountain Women and Spoon Boxes of Daghestan, and the book I'm reviewing here. The title is indeed odd. But it isn't intended merely to be catchy, another one of those volumes appealing on the cover but deadly dull within. Benatar appears genuinely to believe that we are all harmed, and fairly seriously harmed, by being brought into existence and that it would really be better, and better for us, had we never been born. There are two important and immediate objections: how can something that odd, that strange, possibly be true? And, if it is true, why don't we all, or at least those who believe it, go and put an end to things now? Why is Benatar still with us? Is he still with us? He is, and he thinks he has an answer to these objections. I'll come to these below.

There are seven chapters, with five of substance between an introduction and a conclusion. As Benatar acknowledges, most of the heavy work is done in the first two of these. So in Chapter 2, 'Why Coming into Existence is Always a Harm', he argues for the book's central claim. If you're not persuaded by the end of this chapter, you won't be along for the ride. Chapter 3 offers important supplements, and wants to show both that the harms here are considerable, and that our strategies for denying this uncomfortable truth are many and varied. The following chapters, 4-6, explore the consequences, many of them practical, of Benatar's claim. So he argues (in 4) that it is generally wrong to have children, (in 5) that if you've failed to grasp this, and you, or the woman you know, have already conceived, then it would be best to abort as soon as possible, and (in 6) that the ideal size of the human population is zero.

Such conclusions may well be shocking to some. But they do follow, more or less straightforwardly, and more or less predictably, from the earlier claims. And for that reason these later chapters are of relatively little interest. Even so, some of their details are worthy of note, and I'll say something about them here. Then I'll go back to the book's central claim and consider it more fully.

Suppose you accept that bringing someone into existence causes that person a serious harm, and that this harm isn't compensated by any substantial good. Could it, other things being equal, be right to start that person? Fairly clearly, this couldn't be right. Could there, even so, be a moral right for you to start this person? Benatar discusses this question at some length. He concludes that there couldn't be, and so isn't, such a right. Nevertheless, as a self-confessed libertarian he wants to maintain there should continue to be a legal right to have children. But perhaps he's getting cold feet. While a case can often be made for preserving as legal that which is immoral -- adultery, greed, mocking the afflicted -- this isn't easily extended to an area where very considerable harms befall utterly innocent people. It's as if we decide it should be legal to exploit some small third world country that cannot possibly benefit from our actions.

Suppose you accept that to have a child is to bring into existence someone who will thereby be seriously harmed. Could it be right to have this child? The blurb on the book's cover says that Benatar argues that having children is always wrong. That's a mistake. Suppose we can use this child to improve the health of many others, already in existence, who now suffer from considerable pain. Benatar thinks that this is in fact about the best reason for having a child, and far better than having it for it's own sake, in order to have someone to nurture and care for, or some such reason. This is, I think, an interesting and interestingly controversial claim that to some considerable extent stands independently of the main thesis. It deserves fuller consideration.

The abortion debate, on the whole, is between the Pro-Life and the Pro-Choice lobbies. Benatar holds a candle for the Pro-Death view. He thinks that any woman needs 'excellent reasons' not to abort her child. Again, this sounds controversial, but it is little more than a trivial consequence of his main claim. Yet there are two minor complications to take into account. There's a question about existence. Someone might think we start when the sperm meets the egg. So abortion, unlike contraception, isn't preventative. Benatar shares familiar doubts about the timing here, but he is in any event unfussed, as he is concerned with the 'morally relevant' rather than 'biological' sense of existence. So the second complication concerns status. Benatar's view, again familiar, is that the acquisition of moral status comes by degrees, as morally relevant properties are themselves acquired by degrees, and over time. So if the murder of normal adults is wrong, then infanticide is likely wrong, but less so, late term abortion still wrong, but even less so, and so on. In holding to abortion as morally innocuous Benatar, as he acknowledges, follows a somewhat lower trajectory on status acquisition than many, but, that apart, his view is reasonably familiar.

Chapter 6 is somewhat more technical than the others. Perhaps for that reason it is somewhat less interesting. But it can be thought of in two somewhat interwoven halves. In the first, Benatar advances further consequences of his main claim. As all human lives are very bad, the ideal population size is zero. And so it would be better if our species were extinct. But it doesn't follow that this should happen as soon as possible. A rushed extinction would be very bad for millions of extant people. In the second half, Benatar tackles the main arguments of the concluding part of Parfit's Reasons and Persons, and claims to solve the several problems that he raises there. There are two difficulties here. First, there are questions as to how accurate Benatar's summary of a rather long and subtle argument is. I have several worries, but not the space to pursue them here. Second, there is a question about the efficacy of the solutions. Parfit's problems, in a nutshell, arise because of tensions in the differential value of different lives. Some appear to be very good, others so-so, still others barely worth living, and others worse than nothing. The work made of this by insisting that, in one important sense, all lives fall into the last category is perhaps too brisk.

Let's go back to the book's core, and to the objections I raised above. All our lives are very bad and, generally, much worse than we think. So we are systematically and significantly mistaken about their value. Is this really credible? Schopenhauerian considerations might persuade us that we are somewhat generous in appraising our own lives, but Benatar needs more than this concern about self-assessment, and needs to explain how we can falsely believe that all lives, throughout history, are much better than they are. Given that we are not systematically in error about attendant factual beliefs -- we don't overlook the evidence for hell, for example, nor are we seriously mistaken about the balance between good and bad episodes within lives -- it isn't at all easy, I think, to see how such a mistake might be made.

It's hard to see, too, once this mistake is pointed out, why we shouldn't then commit suicide. Benatar insists that there is no strong connection here, and that there are many lives we shouldn't start but which, once started, we should thereafter save. Hence even if it would be better had I never been born, it isn't better that I die now. But is this right? It can be. Suppose someone has sixty very bad years, ten good years, and then dies. His life might be overall not worth living, such that it would have been wrong to cause him to exist. Even so, it would plainly not be wrong to save his life at the end of year sixty. A different case: someone's life is not, in itself, worth living. But in the course of her life she acquires responsibilities such that her death would be bad for many. Starting such a life would be wrong, but then so too would be ending it. Benatar's point against suicide is supposed to cover a much wider range of cases. He thinks there may be disabilities, say leglessness, such that it would be wrong to start a life involving such disabilities, but wrong too to end this life once it is properly under way. This is far from clear. If the life is overall worth living, it isn't wrong to start it. If it's not worth living then suicide is rational. So there is, I think, still some way to go in countering the claim that if coming into existence is a serious harm so too, in general, is continuing in existence. The obvious objections to Benatar's central thesis still stand.

Perhaps we can set these objections aside. It may be that we can in the end explain why Benatar's unpalatable truth has been overlooked. And it may be that if we were to grasp this truth, we would still see a difference between starting a life and continuing with one already under way. But is it true that coming into existence is always a serious harm? How does the argument go?

Consider an initial asymmetry. Some lives are so bad that it would be wrong to start them. There is an obligation not to start these lives. But no lives are so good that it right to start them. There is no obligation to start these lives. Most people will accept the first claim here. Many, but perhaps not most, will accept the second. But let's grant it to Benatar. Where next? Well, most people think that even if there is no obligation, still it is permissible to start good lives. If your life is going to be good, you're not harmed by being brought into existence. But now Benatar thinks that while this is true of a uniformly good life -- one that contains different degrees of pleasure, but never any degree of pain -- it isn't true for mixed lives, those that contain perhaps a lot of pleasure but still some degree of pain. And, in practice, even if not quite in principle, all our lives are in this way mixed. So all our lives are such that it would have been better had they never been started. Buy into a plausible asymmetry, then, and the seemingly implausible claim soon follows.

Now it might not be easy to grasp the detail in this. And Benatar's arguments of this crucial second chapter are certainly convoluted, and considerably more so, I think, than those of his 1997 paper on which this chapter (and thus the book as a whole) is fairly closely based. But on a charitable reconstruction they perhaps run something like this: in thinking that mixed lives can be overall good, and so not wrong to start, we are thinking that good periods can outnumber, outweigh, and compensate for the bad. But the critical compensation point doesn't go through. In accepting the original asymmetry we have in effect already accepted that while there are positive bads there are no corresponding positive goods. There's a difference in kind between goods and bads, or pleasures and pains, such that no number of the former can outweigh any number of the latter. So although lives can be ranked, with, generally, those containing more goods as better than those containing fewer, none of these lives can be positively good. But lives containing any degree of pain or badness are positively bad. And, in fact, all lives contain some pain.  So in fact all lives are positively bad. And it would have been better, other things being equal, if these lives had never been started.

One response is to abandon the asymmetry. It seems plausible but seems as well to have this implausible consequence. And it is more likely that Benatar's claim is false than that the asymmetry is true. But another response is to resist the implication. I can here only hint at a way forward. Suppose you can, as a package, bring seven lives into existence. Six will be good, one will be very bad. You might think it would be wrong to go ahead. Other things equal, starting good lives is permissible, but not starting bad lives is required. We can't justify starting this bad life by appeal to the good in other, separate, lives. So far, things are going Benatar's way. But suppose, instead, you can bring a mixed life into existence. Depending on the mix, this life might well not be bad. Even if a life contains elements which, on their own, would make it worse than nothing, and no element which makes it better than nothing, still, when mixed, these elements might render the life not worse than nothing. A view that is plausible over separate lives is not obviously plausible over blended elements within one life.

So, give Benatar a charitable reading and there are still objections to be made. Give him what may in the end be a fairer reading, and the objections are stronger. Both in the paper and the book he argues thus: suppose you have to choose between two packages. The first contains something good and something bad, while the second contains something good and something neutral. The second package is to be preferred. But the first package is one in which we exist, and where our lives involve both goods and bads, or pleasures and pains. The second is one in which we don't exist, and so there are no pains -- something good, and no pleasures -- something not bad, or neutral. So, on balance, existence is worse than non-existence. This is a dreadful argument. It's most obviously dreadful in taking no account of the quantities of pleasure and pain involved. You might think that Benatar must at least anticipate this objection. Certainly in the paper he doesn't. Not so in the book. There (pp. 45-47) he does attempt to address this challenge. But as he appears almost altogether to misunderstand it, there is just no force in his reply.