Between Levinas and Heidegger

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John E. Drabinski and Eric S. Nelson (eds.), Between Levinas and Heidegger, SUNY Press, 2014, 270pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438452579.

Reviewed by Michael Fagenblat, Shalem College


The political background to the debate between Martin Heidegger and Emmanuel Levinas has often distorted the philosophical dispute. At its worst, Levinas is cast like the Bear Jew in Quentin Tarantino’s Inglorious Basterds, valiantly battling the dastardly Deutsche. Fortunately, this volume approaches the debate with a clear view of the philosophical issues. It avoids polemically misconstruing Heidegger’s thought without making light of Levinas’s modification of it. The chapters approach the debate from a range of complementary angles that bring the discussion to a new level of nuance and understanding. The variety of contributors, which includes established experts and younger scholars, both from France and the U.S., adds to its interest.

Levinas was among the first to appreciate the immense significance of Heidegger’s work. For sixty years he expounded, augmented and remonstrated with Heidegger, but always within the parameters of Heidegger’s critique of representationalism and consciousness-based approaches to meaning-content, which he attempted to steer away from the sort of moral reductionism and political nihilism that Heidegger found there. Levinas’s main idea is that “ethics” — which refers not to an analysis of moral values, language, psychology, dispositions or virtues but to the deontological sense constitutive of the space of meaning — grounds, or orients, or interrupts, the relation of meaning to being. But whether ethical normativity grounds or orients or interrupts the relation between being and meaning — an important distinction he was not always careful to mark — Levinas’s thought stands or falls as a modification of Heidegger’s. “Heidegger seems to me to dominate from above the philosophy of existence, whatever deepenings or modifications one might make to the content of his analysis,” he acknowledged in 1949. Indeed for Levinas, Heidegger marks a fault-line in the history of philosophy, bringing to close the tight coupling of meaning and mind inaugurated by Descartes. Hence he saw himself, in the sanguine moment of this estimation, as modifying Heidegger’s thought. “One can be to him what Malebranche or Spinoza had been to Descartes. It’s not too shabby, but it’s not Descartes.”1

Several of the twelve contributors argue that Levinas’s critique and modification of Heidegger do not succeed. The argument is put most astutely by François Raffoul, so I will return to it as a touchstone. In “The Question of Responsibility between Levinas and Heidegger,” Raffoul reads Being and Time as a work that already shows how the sense of being is ethically determined from the outset. The disclosive attunements of being-as-a-whole individuate Dasein in the mode of conscience. Whichever way Dasein interprets a given event, it does so by being responsive to and responsible for the sense of the beings involved, including other Daseins. In Raffoul’s words,

the call of conscience in Being and Time reveals a singular inscription of otherness within the selfhood of Dasein. . . . the very concept of Dasein is a responsibility for being . . . . Dasein is delivered over to its being, “entrusted” with being, or charged with the responsibility for its being (SZ, 41-42). Care, concern, solicitude, anxiety, authenticity, and being-guilty are all different names for such originary responsibility. (p. 197)

Anyone objecting to Heidegger’s nihilism would do well to keep this originary responsibility in mind. Did Levinas? Raffoul seems to think that Levinas simply misinterpreted Heidegger by mistaking originary responsibility as an investment in Dasein’s “own” being, charging Dasein only with responsibility for “its” being. But, as Raffoul notes, Dasein’s owning of responsibility does not mark a boundary that circumscribes its sphere of existing — this is exactly what Heidegger opposes in contesting the Cartesian-Husserlian idea of a realm of ownness. For Heidegger, rather, the owning of responsibility involves the temporalization of existing concretely, the way an event of meaning in each case involves oneself in its appearing. Nothing in Being and Time suggests that I am only responsible for myself; on the contrary, my ‘self’ is only through my being responsive to entities, including other Daseins, at any given concrete moment. This exposition of originary responsibility is helpful and compelling, though I am not sure it entirely answers Levinas’s concerns. At his best, Levinas accepts this interpretation of Being and Time but contests the phenomenological point. Originary responsibility, he proposes, is not dispersed among beings, as Heidegger thinks, but is produced in relation to a unique sense, hence the privileged role of “the other” who bears the trace of this uniqueness; and the debate between them turns on how to construe the relation between these two modes of responsibility.

Ann Murphy points to a closely related difficulty Levinas faces. The externality of ethical sense can only be understood, she proposes, by the meanings manifest in the presence or intelligible force of “the face”. But this means, as Derrida already showed, that Levinas’s signature concept of “ethics as first philosophy” is untenable, since it depends on the primary order of being. A similar view is maintained by Françoise Dastur, who characterizes the debate as a dichotomous alternative between ‘being’ and ‘ethics’: “the ‘and’ [of Totality and Infinity] has clearly the meaning of an opposition,” she claims, concluding that there is “a spirit of revenge against Being and Time” in Levinas’s work (pp. 141, 153). One problem with the views of Murphy, Dastur and Raffoul is that they view Levinas’s project as a linear grounding of intelligibility, as if he were first describing a purely ethical relation upon which other orders of phenomenological meaning are founded.

Emilia Angelova argues that Levinas’s critique of Heidegger contests the coinciding of possibilities of being with possibilities of meaning, a view that Raffoul, Murphy and Dastur implicitly accept and that usefully characterizes the issue. While the coinciding of being and meaning might describe Being and Time, she suggests that it fails to address Heidegger’s turn toward the thought of being as a trace withdrawn from the horizon of Dasein, a position that has a close “affinity” to Levinas’s view. Eric S. Nelson explores this same affinity from the point of view of Heidegger’s and Levinas’s accounts of history, showing how both philosophers move from the concrete historicization of meaning to attempts at extracting intelligibility from historicity while remaining true to the phenomena themselves. Despite their inimical vocabularies, Nelson shows how Heidegger and Levinas both search for the interruptions of sense within the historical order of meaning. The greater success, in my view, of the approaches by Angelova and Nelson over those of Murphy and Dastur suggests that Levinasian “ethics” might be better construed as interrupting or orienting the relation between being and meaning rather than grounding it.

Another advantage of Angelova's and Nelson's approaches is their willingness to view the "faith" dimension of this debate in phenomenological rather than dogmatic fashion, as a descriptor of the interruptive orientation of the concretion of meaning from within. Philip J. Maloney, Robert Bernasconi and Didier Franck explore this feature of the debate further, though only Maloney foregrounds its religious aspect. His excellent chapter describes the salient disagreement as a "confrontation between two alternative approaches to a properly secularized transcendence" (p. 32). Whereas Heidegger sought to secularize transcendence by viewing it ontologically, not ontically, as the way Dasein surpasses itself and thereby ex-poses meaning in dynamic, holistic relations, Levinas argues that transcendence is secularized when oriented to the uniqueness in the world, as in hunger, which constitutes a self-referential identity amid the interrelations of meaning in being-as-a-whole. The old debate over the meaning of the unity of Transcendence -- wholeness or uniqueness? -- is repeated by Levinas and Heidegger in a secular key that does not refer to a Supreme Being beyond this world but to the phenomenological trace of unity, as wholeness or uniqueness, among concrete beings. This helps explain the difference between the "dispersed" normativity to which Dastur, Murphy and Raffoul point, a normativity pervading being-as-a-whole, and the sens unique of deontological normativity that Levinas thinks remains unexplained by Heidegger's account.

Bernasconi’s, “Useless Sacrifice” shows how a similar problem works its way through Levinas’s and Heidegger’s accounts of sacrifice. As Bernasconi notes, their point is not simply to exhort sacrifice but to show how the different senses of sacrifice are already in play in our ordinary, everyday understanding of the meaning of being, thereby belying the individualism on which much modern Western thought is based. But whereas Heidegger thinks of sacrifice as an overcoming of self through participation in a more comprehensive order of meaning, for Levinas the possibility of sacrifice attests to a love for the life of the unique other that is stronger than the love for oneself. For Franck, it is the shift from truth to testimony that distinguishes Levinas from Heidegger. Testimony is closely bound to the prophetic tradition, which bears witness to the unappropriatability of our normative condition, our inability to authenticate or demonstrate the grounds of normativity. Levinas’s conclusion, as Franck notes, is that the truth of testimony is irreducible to the truth that can be manifest or disclosed and thereby authenticated. Franck thus provides a clear way of distinguishing the respective positions, at least with respect to early Heidegger: the authentic disclosure of the truth of being cannot account for the sincerity that testifies to a truthfulness that cannot be disclosed. Here too, the helpful contrast between authenticity and sincerity takes place in the shadow of a “faith” that dares not speak its name. This is because “faith” encapsulates the original form — historical, phenomenological, and etymological — of the relation between truth and fidelity, which is what this debate is about.

Does Heidegger conceive of fidelity to the truth of being as authentically resolving upon the contingent finitude into which we are thrown, as Franck proposes? Simon Critchley answers in the affirmative, prompting him to a Levinas-inspired modification of Being and Time in which inauthenticity can never be dispelled, especially not in relation to “the people” (das Volk) with whom we find ourselves disposed. In “Originary Inauthenticity,” Critchley is more concerned to argue with and against Heidegger than for Levinas. But Levinas should be given his due. He understood that from the perspective of Being and Time he could well be viewed as “a friend of the inauthentic,” as he once put it; one might further note that without the Levinasian move, which seeks to show how inauthenticity takes the form of responsibility, it remains unclear how an ethics of inauthenticity can avoid degrading from care or respect to mere tolerance or even indifference.2

In “Displaced,” a lucid and evocative contribution, Peter Gordon draws out the stakes of Heidegger’s grounding of meaning in the familiarity of our everyday world. As Gordon shows, this move at once fuels the dynamism of Heidegger’s semantic externalist holism and at the same time stigmatizes those beings that do not belong. Heidegger’s careful attention to the fluidity of the sense of being is, accordingly, thoroughly political, since it grants no “primordial” place, as Heidegger puts it, to the displaced. Levinas, of course, understood precisely this, and long before most, but Gordon is deeply unsatisfied with Levinas’s answer, which he regards as colluding with the dualistic logic of nativism and exclusion that Heidegger set at the very foundations of being. It’s a strong objection, but it would seem to lead to a rejection of the basic terms of the debate, namely, that meaning is grounded in concrete ways of being and appearing, ways that are historical and social through and through. One can, and most philosophers still do, reject such an approach, but it’s not clear Gordon does. He seems to want to enjoy his phenomenological feast without feeling sick afterwards, but he may need an entirely different philosophical diet.

Unless, as John E. Drabinski argues in “Elsewhere of Home,” one can continue being nourished on phenomenology without suffering political indigestion from too much native grub. Like Gordon, Drabinski worries that when both Levinas and Heidegger describe the claim of the other as an interruption (of history or being) they simultaneously reinforce the notion of a monolingual basis upon which meaning takes form. Gordon’s objection to the nativism that underwrites the phenomenologies of Heidegger and Levinas is shared by Drabinski, for whom this nativism is articulated in the mode of being at home in one’s own language. Inspired by Derrida, however, Drabinski finds a way beyond the impasse of phenomenological provincialism in postcolonial writers like Frantz Fanon, Derek Walcott and especially Édouard Glissant, whose factical beginnings are always already constituted in modes of displacement. These thinkers show us how to live from an elemental milieu and language originally marked by rupture and dislocation, and therefore one for which there can be no nostalgia, for it is a language in which one was never at home. Unlike Heidegger and Levinas, who begin at home in order to venture elsewhere, to say the native language otherwise and welcome the stranger, they begin amid an already creolized language that lacks the pretense of having been whole. They write and think not from their thrownness into a familiar world and a grounding language but from the abyss marked on one side by the necessity of resisting the colonial language and on the other by the impossibility of speaking in a pure, decolonized voice. This also approaches Critchley’s notion of “Originary Inauthenticity” from a novel direction. It is a thoroughly and somehow fresh Derridean approach that neither forsakes phenomenological concretion nor indulges its logic of nativism. To be sure, one could object that in truth Heidegger and Levinas displace autochthony and creolize monolingualism. Heidegger’s analysis of the call of conscience “as the ‘not-as-home’ . . . like an alien voice” (SZ, 276-77) and Levinas’s account of “the posteriority of the anterior” (TI) or the “immemorial past” (OBBE) suggest that displacement and estrangement are “primordial,” even if this is routinely forgotten or disavowed. But the rejoinder may not extend as far as Drabinski or Gordon would like.

Krzysztof Ziarek’s “Which Other, Whose Alternity?” returns us to the salient point raised by Raffoul. If Raffoul showed how Heidegger was concerned with the normativity intrinsic to Dasein, Ziarek makes the equally important point of showing how later Heidegger is no less concerned with the normativity intrinsic to being (as Seyn). Ziarek takes the debate to where it genuinely seems to divide, at the point where normativity and humanism part ways. He shows how Heidegger extends the “originary responsibility” of Dasein to what Jean-Luc Nancy calls an “originary ethics” of the releasement of the dignity of beings from the powers that enframe them, powers maintained by the subject, the concept, worldviews, technologies, laws, political institutions, and so forth. Moreover, Heidegger develops this ethics of being without confining himself to anthropocentric arrogations of notions like dignity and releasement in the guise of humanism and autonomy, as Levinas seems to do. Despite “a genuine proximity between Levinas and Heidegger” in their attempts to think a “power-free relationality,” Ziarek concludes that in terms of the “scope” of their respective projects Levinas remains concerned with “interhuman relations,” while Heidegger is interested in applying it “to all beings” (p. 242). This is a sensible way of contrasting Levinas and Heidegger that is consistent with the dominant reception of Levinas as a humanist who privileges the human form of “the Other”.

But it is not the only way of reading Levinas. Neither Ziarek nor the other contributors make much of the possibility that there is a substantive turn — a Kehre? — from early to late Levinas. And yet at the center of Levinas’s later work we find a deep appreciation of “modern antihumanism,” which he regards as making way for an account of responsibility that has “abandoned the idea of person” as a “goal and origin of itself” and is not grounded on the powers and limits of an individual will. Evidently endorsing Heidegger’s famous remark that “humanism . . . does not set the humanitas of man high enough,” Levinas here says that “Humanism has to be denounced only because it is not sufficiently human.”3 Ziarek alludes to this alternative reading of Levinas as a post-humanist thinker but, like several of the contributors, takes this in the direction of an anthropomorphic theology that merely refigures “the Other” as a metaphysical and seemly dogmatic postulate.

It would, however, be possible to show how Levinas’s move beyond humanism leads to a non-anthropocentric secularized theology in which the abused name “God” signifies as glory, as Levinas calls it, which is another way of saying dignitas. The glory of ethics alludes to a normativity that “fills the whole earth” (Isa. 6:3), thus exceeding the limits of humanism, while acknowledging the impossibility of manifesting the grounds of normativity as such (Exod. 33:20). For later Levinas, “ethics” reaches beyond the scale of humanism; the human other dis-appears, is de-faced, and the Good signifies without presenting the source of authority from whence it issues, leaving one under the sway of a normativity that has no proper name, neither that of Being nor of the human Other. It comes "from I know not where. . . . Authority is not somewhere, where a look could go seek it, like an idol, or assume it like a logos. . . . It is the pure trace of a “wandering cause,” inscribed in me."4 A counter-reading of Levinas could show that his indefatigable search for the origins of normativity lead him not only “beyond the face” and then “beyond being,” but even “beyond the other”. And if he thereby tends toward God, it is only by an abuse of language, as he always says. If so, the “scope” of Levinas’s alleged humanism may not in the end fall short of Heidegger’s account of the dignity of all beings but may simply make dignity shine a little clearer, like shook foil.

1 Levinas, En découvrant l’existence avec Husserl et Heidegger (Paris: Vrin, 1974), 101.

2 Levinas, Entre Nous: Thinking-of-the-Other, trans. Michael B. Smith and Barbara Harshav (New York: Columbia University Press, 1998), 226. In fairness to Critchley, his work on “love” in The Faith of the Faithless is precisely an attempt to give form to the ethics of inauthenticity he outlines in this chapter.

3 Levinas, Otherwise than Being or Beyond Essence, trans. Alphonso Lingis (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1991), 127-28.

4 Levinas, Otherwise than Being or Beyond Essence, 150.