Between Logic and the World: An Integrated Theory of Generics

Placeholder book cover

Bernhard Nickel, Between Logic and the World: An Integrated Theory of Generics, Oxford University Press, 2016, 277pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199640003.

Reviewed by Rachel Katharine Sterken, University of Oslo


Some theorists, faced with the seemingly impossible task of coming up with an adequate semantic theory of generic sentences, eschew semantic theory entirely and locate the interesting properties of generics in the metaphysics of what we might call, genericity. Such a metaphysical theory is allowed to be unsystematic in a way that the semantic theory cannot be, allowing such theorists to place the philosophically interesting phenomenon that seems to underlie generic meaning, outside of the semantic theory altogether. Noteworthy recent examples include Sarah-Jane Leslie who sees genericity as a fundamentally mental phenomenon (cf. Leslie, 2007, p. 386, on the "worldly truth-makers" of generics), and David Liebesman (2011) who sees genericity as fundamentally about how kinds can inherit properties from their members, which may be very different from case to case. (This way of thinking traces back to the early Greg N. Carlson (1977).) My theory can also be seen along the same lines: Sterken (2015) draws on indexicality and context-sensitivity as a means to eschew semantic theorizing. Instead, I offer a metasemantic account of the theoretically interesting properties of generic meaning.

By contrast, the standard approach in theorizing about generics is to treat the semantic theory as ipso facto a theory of genericity. All the interesting properties of the intuitive truth-conditions of generics are semantically relevant and to be encoded in their semantics.

Bernhard Nickel takes a more nuanced approach. He argues that a theory of genericity should be conceptually independent from a theory of generics. Of course, the two theories will be intimately connected: The meaning of generics should manifest genericity in some way and the linguistic phenomena should give us a window into the metaphysical phenomena. (The theories should mutually evidentially support each other.) But they are independent: The seeming impossibility of providing an adequate semantics doesn't demand that there is no interesting semantic theory to be had, but at the same time, all the interesting features of the intuitive truth-conditions of generics needn't be semantically relevant.

In many cases of theorizing about the meaning of particular expressions (for example, theorizing about the or spy), there is no philosophically interesting underlying metaphysics worthy of theorizing about. There is, for example, no interesting field studying the metaphysics of definiteness, or the metaphysics of spyhood. In other cases, there is a rich, independent metaphysics associated with the phenomena that our thought and talk is aiming to capture -- for example, modals and modality. Nickel invites us to understand generics and genericity by analogy with modals and modality.

Given the contention that the two theories are robust and independent, the book presents three ambitious theories -- a semantic theory of generics, a metaphysical theory of genericity and a theory of how the two are related.

Nickel is already an important contributor to the literature on the semantics of generics, and much of Part I (Chapters 3-6) brings together his earlier work (notably,2006, 2008, 2010, 2013). However, Part I is not merely a compilation of his existing work. Rather, it presents his existing material in a fresh way, offers a great deal of new and original material, and most importantly, is interwoven with discussion of his overall project of integrating the semantics with the theory of genericity -- which allows readers to see precisely how the semantic facts have significance for the theory of genericity, and vice versa.

Though the discussions on semantics takes up a good part of the book, it is clear throughout that Nickel takes the more central project to be the theory of genericity. However, that theory can only, at least initially, be gleaned by an accurate and precise semantic theory: Not all generics will provide direct evidence of genericity -- having a detailed and accurate semantic theory will allow theorists to distill the genericity from any irrelevant interacting semantic factors.

Chapter 3 offers a fresh presentation of the basics of Nickel's semantic theory. According to Nickel, generics quantify over normal members of the kind in the actual world or in close counterfactual worlds. In schematic form, the truth-conditions for a generic, Ks are F, go as follows:

(1) If there was a normal K, then all normal Ks are F.

The tough theoretical work is to provide an adequate notion of normality understood as a property of individuals. One of Nickel's main innovations is to introduce structural sophistication into his notion of normality by appealing to respects of normality and ways of being normal. I will summarize Nickel's motivation for respects of normality and ways of being normal in a moment. First, it will be useful to see the truth-conditions for a generic, Ks are F, that Nickel ultimately ends up with (ignoring the modal component for simplicity).

(2) There exists a way of being a normal K with respect to Fness, such that all Ks that are normal in this way, are F.

Normality in a Respect: Respects of normality are motivated by data like that in (3):

(3) a. Birds lay eggs.
     b. All layers are necessarily female.
     c. Birds are female.

Though (3a) is intuitively true, we do not conclude (3c) on the basis of (3a) and (3b). However, if the domain of normal birds quantified over is fixed, then (3a) is true just in case all the normal birds lay eggs, and since all egg layers are necessarily female, we can conclude that all normal birds are female, but that means (3a) and (3b) entail (3c). In order to ensure that generics, like (3a) and (3c), quantify over different domains, Nickel's idea is to relativize the notion of normality to respects of normality. (3a) quantifies over birds that are normal with respect to method of extrusion of offspring, while (3c) quantifies over birds that are normal with respect to biological sex. Thus, (3a) and (3c) quantify over different domains and we cannot automatically conclude (3c) on the basis of (3a) and (3b).

There are numerous respects in which a member of a kind can be normal: method of extrusion of offspring, color, gender, wing-span, etc. The respect of normality relevant for the interpretation of a given generic is determined by the predicated property. If the predicated property is laying eggs or giving birth to live young, then the respect of normality at issue is normality with respect to method of extrusion of offspring.

Ways of Being Normal: Nickel asks us to consider generics where it seems like the normal members of the kind are partitioned by a number of properties that are related by a respect.

(4) Elephants live in Africa and Asia.

These generics are intuitively true, even when there are no individual elephants that live in both Africa and Asia. That is, (4) can be interpreted as in (5):

(5) Elephants live in Africa and Elephants live in Asia.

But this is problematic from the point of view of any theory that treats generics as majority quantified over a fixed domain (note that both predicates determine the same respect of normality): Such views will not make (4) come out as true. If they are majority quantified and the domain of elephants quantified over in each conjunct is the same (as in (6a) and (6b)), then in order for the conjunction to be true, there must be a proportion of individual elephants that live in both Africa and Asia.

(6) a. All normal elephants live in Africa and all normal elephants live in Asia.
     b. Most elephants live in Africa and most elephants live in Asia.

Nickel suggests that generics do not just tell us about what is normal (in a respect) for a kind, but rather about the ways of being normal (in a respect) for a kind. There are different ways of being a normal elephant with respect to habitat -- one way is to live in Africa and another way is to live in Asia.

An important and distinctive feature of Nickel's account is that his truth-conditions are weakened in terms of existential quantification over ways of being normal in a respect. This weakening is both appealing and problematic. It is appealing since it accounts for cases like (4), but it is problematic since it seems to over-predict true readings of apparently false generics: Nickel's semantics predicts that both of the generics in (7) are true (platypuses and echidnas are mammals that lay eggs), but only (7a) is intuitively true.

(7) a. Mammals give birth to live young.
     b. Mammals lay eggs.

Nickel's solution is to claim that in the case of (7b), but not (7a), there is a false quantity implicature -- to the effect that laying eggs is the only way of being normal with respect to method of extrusion of offspring -- which accounts for the apparent falsity of (7b). However, it is unclear whether such a solution will ultimately work out, not only for (7b), but in general [cf. Sterken (2015, pp. 8-9)].

That said, some independent evidence for weakening the truth-conditions of generics, as Nickel does, comes from the interaction of generics with negation: Nickel claims that when there is no way of being a normal member of the kind with respect to Fness, like in the (false) generic, Ravens are white, the negation comes out as clearly true, as illustrated by the intuitive truth of Ravens aren't white. However, this is not so in the case of generics like (7b) -- which are seemingly false, but which Nickel claims are true: when such generics are negated, they aren't clearly true at all -- witness Mammals don't lay eggs. The reason Mammals don't lay eggs is not clearly true is because we are aware of egg laying as a way of being a normal mammal with respect to method of extrusion of offspring -- indicating that (7b) is in fact true despite appearances otherwise. (Chapters 5, especially section 5.3, discusses an additional advantage.)

Further, by understanding the truth-conditions of generics as weakened in the way Nickel does, he ends up with an important result: Contrary to popular opinion, there is a logic of generics -- that is, a deductively valid inference pattern involving Gen. This result is significant since it is commonly thought that generics only validate non-monotonic or defeasibly valid inference patterns. Nickel argues that the following pattern holds (cf. p. 70 and p. 203):

(Kind Percolation)  Where As and Bs are kinds, and the As are a subkind of the Bs, the following inference is valid.

As are F.

Therefore, Bs are F. (p. 70)

Chapter 4 provides novel critical examination of several competing theories, including those of Leslie (2008), Ariel Cohen (1999), Yael Greenberg (2007) and Michael Thomson (1998).

Chapter 5 and 6 present two important applications of the semantics -- conjunctive strengthening, gradability and generic comparisons, as well as discussion of some additional features of the semantics -- cf. especially the discussion of homogeneity (p. 129).

Part II discusses the theory of genericity. Section 7.1 in Chapter 7, in particular, presents the nuts and bolts of Nickel's theory of genericity. For Nickel, genericity consists in a relationship between a kind and a property -- the relationship of a property characterizing a kind. For example, blackness is characteristic of the kind raven, and this, in part, explains the truth of ravens are black. (The 'in part' qualification here is important: Recall that the theory of genericity is not ipso facto a theory of the truth-conditions of generic sentences.) Giving a theory of genericity will consist, then, in giving necessary and sufficient conditions for a property to be characteristic for a kind. This is not done in terms of the property being prevalent amongst members of the kind, but rather in terms of explanatory considerations. Roughly, instead of grounding characteristicness in terms of how many members of the kind satisfy the property, Nickel's theory grounds characteristicness in terms of why the property is present among members of the kind. The appeal of this approach can be illustrated by considering the pair of generics in (8):

(8) a. Ravens live 10-15 years. 
     b. Sea-turtles live 80 years.

Both (8a) and (8b) are intuitively true, and yet the proportion of ravens that live 10-15 years is much greater than the proportion of sea-turtles that reach maturity (most sea-turtles die soon after hatching). Thus, the issue of how many doesn't seem relevant. However, if one asks why ravens live 10-15 years, or why sea-turtles live 80 years, there is a similar evolutionary explanation in each case, in terms of adaptive responses to selective pressures. This suggests that the truth of (8a) and (8b) are sensitive to there being some suitable explanation of why any members that possess the predicated property, indeed possess that property.

In Section 7.1, Nickel develops and motivates detailed constraints on what explanations count as suitable -- i.e., what explanations are capable of grounding characteristicness.

In addition, Nickel argues that there are many distinct theoretical benefits of grounding genericity in suitable explanation. One benefit, as we've seen, is that it eliminates from consideration the vexing issue of having to tinker with prevalence (recall (8a) and (8b), amongst the numerous other contrast cases in the literature: mosquitoes carry malaria, primes are odd, lions have manes, etc) -- instead we can tinker with what explanations count as suitable, which Nickel argues is less vexing.

Another benefit is that it can capture the intuitive sense that some generics seem more stable and objective than others: Their underlying explanations differ in their stability and objectivity. (8a), for instance, seems more stable and objective than say Dobermans have pointy ears, and that's because the underlying explanations for why the kinds have the given properties differ in stability and objectivity: Our interest in the coloration of ravens will almost always involve biological explanation of a particular sort, and the aim will be to describe the coloration of ravens in natural terms. Dobermans have pointy ears, on the other hand, is false when natural, biological explanation is our aim, but is true when our explanatory interests are tied to understanding the appearance of Dobermans in terms of social facts involving human intervention and dog breeding.

A third, related benefit is that appeal to explanations in terms of social conventions can explain an otherwise troublesome interpretation of some generics -- known as the rules-and-regulations interpretation. A prominent example is the generic: Bishops move diagonally. Most theorists cannot explain the rules-and-regulations reading as part of their semantics of generics, and instead posit systematic ambiguity, with the rules-and-regulation reading typically being non-generic. Nickel, on the other hand, can easily explain such interpretations as manifesting genericity and without positing ambiguity.

According to Nickel's theory of genericity, genericity is a relation between a property and a kind. However, recall that his semantics for generics does not involve a kind-predicating logical form. Indeed, Nickel argues in Chapter 2 and Chapter 5, that generics involve an unpronounced quantifier expression Gen at the level of logical form. Thus, generics express generalisations over individual members of the kind -- the normal members. How, then, does he connect genericity to this semantics? An abbreviated answer is that he provides a bridging principle between what characterizes a kind and what properties the normal members of that kind possess. The crucial connection lies in mechanisms. Characteristicness is spelled out in terms of suitable explanations, such explanations will identify certain mechanisms as correspondingly suitable and the normal members are the ones that are involved in this mechanism. The bridging principle, in more technical detail, is thus:

            Mapping Characteristicness to Normality

For a given kind K and set of explanatory strategies S, and for each characteristic property P of Ks relative to S:

the property of participating in the mechanism associated with K, S, and P is a way of being a P-normal K relative to S. (p. 197)

Though the bridging principle in its own right looks rather simple, it is important not to underestimate what it accomplishes. With it, not only do we get a way to connect genericity to the semantics of generics, but also a robust, logically complex, structured notion of normality in terms of characteristicness.

Earlier, I presented a range of approaches one can take to the relationship between generics and genericity and situated Nickel's approach within that range. It is helpful to do something similar to compare the substance of his view about genericity to some other influential views. Recall that the substantial concept in theorizing about generics for Nickel is explanation. This brings with it a rather intellectualized notion of the role of generics in our thought and talk. On his account speakers always have in view some explanatory principles, aims and interests when asserting, or invoking in thought, any given generic. By contrast, the substance of Leslie's theory is to treat generics as closely tied to basic psychological mechanisms. On her approach, generics are very coarse-grained, blunt tools of our thought and talk: Speakers don't reflect on or try to rationalize the contents of their generic thought and talk. Another contrast is with the substance of Cohen's theory that understands generics in probabilistic terms. His view is very naturally embedded in a theory of probabilistic reasoning and sees generics are relatively fine-grained tools for understanding the world in terms of how many. Each of these approaches does well in accounting for some examples of the ways in which generics are invoked in our thought and talk, while having trouble with other examples. Nickel's view is not an exception in this regard -- the chief criticism being the charge of over-intellectualizing of our generic thought and talk. We saw this is the case of (7b) and is likely the case for a broad range of uses of generics in quotidian life -- e.g., bread from my corner bakery is yummy.

The book, of course, does not answer all the theoretically interesting and pressing issues connected to generics and genericity. In particular, there is an influx of recent work in psychology which attempts to understand the psychological roles and effects of generic thought. Though Nickel hints at how the semantic and metaphysical theories he offers may be psychologically significant, it is unclear at this stage how to plausibly integrate his theories with psychological theory.

In closing, Nickel's book offers a rich, novel approach to theorizing about generics, and cutting edge theories of their semantics and associated metaphysics. The book succeeds at lifting the level of philosophical, methodological and technical sophistication of the subject matter. Anyone interested in philosophy of language, metaphysics or the connections between them will profit greatly from reading it.


Carlson, G. (1977) Reference to Kinds in English. PhD thesis, University of Massachusetts, Amherst.

Cohen (1999) Think Generic! CSLI Publications.

Greenberg, Y. (2007) Exceptions to generics: where vagueness, context dependence and modality interact. Journal of Semantics, 24(2), 131-167.

Leslie, S.-J. (2007) Generics and the structure of the mind. In J. Hawthorne (Ed.): Philosophical Perspectives, 21, Philosophy of Mind, 375-403.

______ (2008) Generics: cognition and acquisition. Philosophical Review, 117(1), 1-47.

Liebesman, D. (2011) Simple generics. Noûs. 45(3), 409-442.

Nickel, B. (2006) Semantics for characterizing sentences. In J. Gajewski, V. Hacquard, B. Nickel, & S. Yalcin (Eds.): Recent Work on Modality, pp. 123-147. MIT Press.

______ (2008) Generics and the ways of normality. Linguistics and Philosophy, 31(6), 629-648.

______ (2010) Generic comparisons. Journal of Semantics, 27(2), 207-242.

______ (2013) Dutchmen are good sailors: generics and gradability. In A. Mari, C. Beyssade, & F.D. Prete (Eds.): Genericity, pp. 390-405. Oxford University Press.

Sterken, R.K. (2015) Generics in context. Philosophers' Imprint, 15(21), 1-30.

Thomson, M. (1998) The Representation of life. In R. Hursthouse, G. Lawrence, and W. Quinn (Eds.): Virtues and Reasons: Philippa Foot and Moral Theory. Clarendon Press, 247-296.