Between Naturalism and Religion: Philosophical Essays

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Jürgen Habermas, Between Naturalism and Religion: Philosophical Essays, Ciaran Cronin (trans.), Polity Press, 2008, 361pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745638256.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Flynn, Fordham University


Habermas's central aim in this collection of essays is to articulate the appropriate relation between "postmetaphysical thinking" and science and religion. He takes up issues related to both the philosophical and the public use of reason, and makes interesting proposals regarding their interrelation. Habermas is clearly worried about the spread of naturalistic worldviews ("scientism") and religious fundamentalism, but he dismisses neither naturalism nor religion. Rather, he defends what he calls "soft naturalism," which embraces a non-reductionist account of human language and thought in which normativity and intersubjectivity are central. Regarding religion, Habermas maintains that philosophy has long been enriched by secular "translations" of religious ideas. Moreover, he views at least "modernized" religions as allies in the public sphere in combating the effects of uncontrolled capitalist modernization and the spread of reductionistic thinking.

Postmetaphysical thinking tries to avoid promoting any particular worldview and focuses on procedural rationality and reconstructing the normativity inherent in linguistic practices. Although heavily indebted to Kant, Habermas maintains that postmetaphysical thinking must be detranscendentalized, that is, reason must be properly situated within history and social reality. Habermas thus follows in the traditions of hermeneutics and pragmatism, but attempts to avoid historicism or contextualism by emphasizing immanent idealizing presuppositions made by speakers. Chapter 2, "Communicative Action and the Detranscendentalized 'Use of Reason'," details the genealogical connection between ideas of reason in Kant's transcendental philosophy and their analogues in Habermas's formal pragmatics. The first half of the essay provides not only an excellent overview of Habermas's central ideas but also sets the stage for engaging analytic philosophy of language from Frege up through two paths that diverge according to how they treat the normativity of language: the Carnap-Quine-Davidson branch, which attempts to "defuse" it, and the Wittgenstein-Dummett-Brandom branch, which attempts to reconstruct it.

Chapter 2 ends with a continuation of Habermas's critical engagement with Brandom, while Chapter 3, "On the Architectonics of Discursive Differentiation," extends his longstanding exchange with Karl Otto-Apel. Together these debates form part of a family quarrel among pragmatist conceptions of language: the first goes back to the publication of Brandom's Making It Explicit,[1] while collaboration with Apel goes back much further, to their graduate work in Bonn (97). One dispute with Brandom is whether there are actually universal presuppositions implicit in linguistic practices, while Habermas and Apel agree on this point but disagree on their nature and status. Habermas's position between the two can thus be viewed in terms of getting at the right level of transcendental analysis. He tries to push Brandom up a notch, to take note of the "unavoidable" presuppositions made by participants in argumentation, which he characterizes as "(weak) transcendental presuppositions" (83) in contrast to Apel's more transcendental approach. Chapter 3 is also an important further clarification of Habermas's version of discourse theory with regard to the notions of and relation between legal and moral validity.

Two essays focus directly on the critique of reductionistic naturalism: Chapter 6, "Freedom and Determinism," and Chapter 7, "'I Myself am Part of Nature' -- Adorno on the Intrication of Reason in Nature." Both essays share Kant's aim of doing justice to our intuitive understanding of ourselves as free while satisfying the "need for a coherent picture of the universe that includes humans as part of nature" (153). Habermas wants to explain how we are socialized into an irreducibly normative "space of reasons" in a way that is consistent with our being products of natural evolution, thereby reconciling Kant with Darwin and establishing the "right way to naturalize the mind" (152-3). The challenge is whether we can maintain the "reflexive stability" of our consciousness of freedom in the face of "destabilizing" knowledge of the world as a closed causal system and specific knowledge provided by natural sciences, in particular cognitive science and neurobiology (Ch. 6) and possibilities for manipulating the human genome (Ch. 7).

The main arguments distinguishing "hard" from "soft" naturalism rely heavily on the distinction between participant and observer perspectives, which has long been central to Habermas's methodology in philosophy and social theory. Only from the participant perspective can one reconstruct the norm-laden internal point of view of agents engaged in speech, action, and argumentation. This contrasts with the external, objectifying perspective of an observer on speaking and acting subjects or social institutions. Neither perspective can be reduced to the other and not everything accessible from one can be encompassed by the other (206). Consistent with detranscendentalizing Kant, Habermas maintains this perspectival dualism is methodological, not ontological. Moreover, he is critical of any reductionistic approaches that naturalize language and thought in a way that ignores or eliminates the participant perspective. In Chapter 2, for example, Davidson is criticized for analyzing language from the perspective of an empirical theorist making behavioral observations (56).

In brief, one of the core arguments against hard naturalism in Chapters 6 and 7 is that perspectival dualism is inescapable for us (169-70, 206-8). The observer perspective does not undermine the participant perspective if we can show that the two are complementary but irreducible, and then show how perspectival dualism is itself "part of our nature." Forced to adapt to both natural and social environments, we have evolved into beings capable of dealing with both "observable causes" and "understandable reasons" (165). Habermas supports his position with accounts of the origins of human cognition within the species and in the socialization process of individuals, focusing on our ability to attribute intentionality to fellow human beings (170-3).

It might seem that, based on its considerable capacity for explanation and prediction, scientific knowledge deserves priority over hermeneutic knowledge. But Habermas points out that even knowledge acquired through experimental observation, along with theory choice, must be defended with arguments, which requires the performative stance of understanding. Since the complementary relation between the two epistemic perspectives cannot even be avoided within the activity of research itself, Habermas maintains that strong reductionism is implausible: "We can learn something from the confrontation with reality only to the extent that we are at the same time able to learn from the criticism of others. The ontologization of natural scientific knowledge into a naturalistic worldview reduced to 'hard' facts is not science but bad metaphysics" (207).

The main point here seems right: scientific knowledge acquired through the objectifying attitude, which has the potential to destabilize our sense of freedom, ultimately still has to be defended through arguments with others, a process that presupposes the participant perspective, which is the very perspective from which our sense of ourselves as acting freely and being accountable to others for beliefs and actions is operative. This move undermines the idea of the objectifying perspective as the "unquestioned yardstick against which the reflexive stability of acting subjects' consciousness of freedom must be measured" (200). But once undermined as the unquestioned yardstick, can the problem just arise again at a higher level? If the dualism is ineradicable, is the instability too? Our sense of freedom can still be continually destabilized by arguments based on specific scientific knowledge. Perhaps modern science has permanently destabilized the participant perspective and the most we can hope for is recovering relative stability based on a shift in the default position away from natural science as the sole yardstick for understanding ourselves. Habermas might agree with this, but I am unsure how far his arguments are supposed to go on this point.

Turning to religion, the core idea that comes up in four of the five remaining essays is that of viewing secularization in the modern West as a complementary learning process between the perspectives of reason and religion, which "compels the traditions of the Enlightenment and religious teachings to reflect on each other's limits" (102). This has both philosophical implications for working out the relation between postmetaphysical reason and religious traditions, and political implications for the role of religion within the modern constitutional state. Chapter 4, "Prepolitical Foundations of the Constitutional State?," develops the core idea and embodies it performatively insofar as it was prepared for a discussion with Joseph Cardinal Ratzinger in January 2004.[2] It also briefly touches on most of the themes more thoroughly developed in the other essays: the relation between philosophy and religion (Ch. 8), the role of religion in the public sphere and the relation between secular and religious citizens (Ch. 5), and the idea of toleration (Ch. 9).

Chapter 8, "The Boundary between Faith and Knowledge: On the Reception and Contemporary Importance of Kant's Philosophy of Religion," engages Kant's philosophy of religion and traces its critical reception up through Hegel, Schleiermacher, and Kierkegaard. Although Habermas accepts many of their criticisms, he still maintains the twin Kantian ideas of (i) appropriating the content of religious ideas on a rational basis, while (ii) maintaining the right boundary between faith and knowledge. Regarding the latter, Habermas situates postmetaphysical philosophy between the two poles of regression (a return to metaphysics) and transgression (attempts to "go beyond" the limits between philosophy and religion, e.g., late Heidegger) (243-7).

Regarding the first Kantian idea, Habermas notes the following successful translations of the "cognitive content" of religious ideas into ideas not dependent on religious revelation for their validity: Kant's translation of the idea of creation in the image of God into that of equal and unconditional dignity (110), Marx's translation of the idea of the kingdom of God on earth into that of an emancipated society (231), and Walter Benjamin's translation of ideas about messianic hope and redemption into "anamnestic solidarity" with those who suffered past injustices (241). "Reflexive appropriation" of religious ideas is still needed because postmetaphysical philosophy simply does not have the resources to respond to some of the most pressing challenges in modern society, such as (i) the spread of "scientistic" self-understandings that encourage instrumentalizing ourselves and (ii) an "uncontrolled process of modernization" (107, 238) in which markets and state bureaucracies displace social solidarity. The result is an "atrophied normative consciousness" (240) and a decline in sensitivity to social suffering. In the face of that, a "sober postmetaphysical philosophy" simply lacks the "creativity of linguistic world-disclosure" needed to "regenerate" a declining normative consciousness (211).

This is partly why it is important, as Habermas argues in Chapter 5, "Religion in the Public Sphere," that religious language be allowed in the informal public sphere. On the ethics of citizenship, Habermas forges a middle path between Rawls and his critics (e.g., Nicholas Wolterstorff and Paul Weithman), agreeing with Rawls that a secular state requires an "institutional filter" that prevents religious reasons from entering into formal justifications of laws and court decisions, but agreeing with Rawls's critics that citizens within the informal public sphere should be allowed to use religious language without restriction. Translating religious arguments into secular terms is still required at some point in order for them to potentially pass through the institutional filter, but this burden does not rest solely on religious citizens. The cooperative task of translation is also to be shared by secular citizens, which is supposed to mitigate to some extent the asymmetrical burdens of citizenship that arise because religious citizens must ultimately have their religious convictions translated into secular variants while secular citizens bear no such burden. But this can only be expected of secular citizens if they are also "expected not to exclude the possibility that [religious] contributions may have cognitive substance" (139). That is, they must take a "postsecular stance" toward religion as opposed to a "secularist stance" (my terms): the former matches up with Habermas's philosophical position of being open to learning from religious traditions, while the latter might say, among other things, that religions are merely "archaic relics" that "will ultimately dissolve in the acid of scientific criticism" (138-9).

There is a nice convergence here between the philosophical task Habermas sets himself in working out the self-critical relation of reason to religion in Chapter 8 and the burden placed on secular citizens in a "postsecular society." This turns the translation project carried out until now monologically by philosophers into a dialogical enterprise to be taken up by citizens themselves. But maybe this fits together too nicely. Cristina Lafont has objected that Habermas strangely places no restrictions on religious citizens' contributions in the informal public sphere while requiring secular citizens to take up the postsecular stance. But what if the latter are deeply committed secularists or atheists?[3] It might be helpful here to more clearly distinguish several claims, as Habermas does at the end of Chapter 4. He maintains that secular citizens (i) should not challenge religious citizens' right to use religious language in the informal public sphere, (ii) nor "deny religious worldviews are in principle capable of truth," and (iii) can even be expected to participate in translation efforts (113). Lafont does not contest (i), but I think she is right to challenge (ii) by arguing that taking religious contributions seriously should only require that secular citizens "engage them seriously … regardless of what their personal cognitive stance toward the cognitive substance of religion may be."[4] Thus, (ii) should not be required of secular citizens. However, Habermas is probably right that accepting (ii) is a precondition for (iii), that for the most part something like the postsecular stance is the kind of epistemic attitude one must have in order to seriously engage in the demanding project of translation. But surely this project cannot be reasonably expected of all citizens. Most secular citizens lack, as Habermas admits many religious citizens lack, the "knowledge or imagination" for this task (127), especially given that his exemplars are all great philosophers.

Two other chapters make significant contributions to the discussion of toleration and multiculturalism: Chapter 9, "Religious Tolerance as a Pacemaker for Cultural Rights," and Chapter 10, "Equal Treatment of Cultures and the Limits of Postmodern Liberalism." It is worth noting that Habermas's work in political philosophy is often accused of empty proceduralism, but many of the essays here explore normative virtues and epistemic attitudes required of citizens in a way that goes well beyond procedural analysis.

The final chapter, "A Political Constitution for the Pluralist World Society?," is one of the most recent installments in Habermas's articulation of Kantian cosmopolitanism in terms of global constitutionalism.[5] The core idea is that of a multilevel system -- including states, strong "transnational" regimes such as the E.U., and "supranational" organizations like the UN -- that establishes "a politically constituted world society without a world government" (316). The point most relevant to themes in this collection is Habermas's claim that actions at the supranational level -- which are based on the "negative duties of a universalistic morality of justice" -- are legitimated by a thin "worldwide background consensus" that transcends cultural and religious differences. Moreover, "shared moral indignation" in response to "egregious human rights violations and manifest acts of aggression … gradually produce[s] traces of cosmopolitan solidarity" (344). Elsewhere I have expressed doubts about whether this account of cosmopolitan solidarity is fully adequate, not because this form of shared moral indignation is not minimal enough but because there are growing de-legitimizing forces arising from moral indignation over the failure of the international community to take seriously the rights of the global poor, rights which are not given the same status in this framework as the "negative duties" Habermas tends to privilege.[6]

I should also mention Chapter 1, "Public Space and Political Public Sphere," which is a rare autobiographical reflection in which Habermas identifies the roots of his scholarly and political "obsession" (13) with certain concepts -- "public space," "discourse," and "reason" -- in various episodes in his life. This collection extends those core concepts into diverse areas and engages such a wide range of interlocutors that the demands on the reader are quite high. But so is the payoff, since Habermas is one of the few contemporary philosophers who successfully cross so many of the standard divisions: between analytic and Continental philosophy, between practical and theoretical philosophy, and between philosophy as a theoretical enterprise and public intellectual life.[7]

[1] On their earlier debate, see Jürgen Habermas, "From Kant to Hegel: On Robert Brandom's Pragmatic Philosophy of Language," and Robert Brandom, "Facts, Norms, and Normative Facts: Reply to Habermas," both in European Journal of Philosophy 8:3 (2000).

[2] Their remarks were published together as Joseph Cardinal Ratzinger (Pope Benedict XVI) and Jürgen Habermas, Dialectics of Secularization: On Reason and Religion, edited by Florian Schuller (Ignatius Press, 2006).

[3] See Cristina Lafont, "Religious in the Public Sphere," Constellations 14:2 (2007). Lafont is responding to the original publication of this chapter as Jürgen Habermas, "Religion in the Public Sphere," European Journal of Philosophy 14:1 (2006).

[4] Lafont, 249.

[5] See the fuller account in his, "Does the Constitutionalization of International Law Still Have a Chance?," in The Divided West, trans. by Ciaran Cronin (Polity 2006), and his recent defense against critics: "The Constitutionalization of International Law and the Legitimation Problems of A Constitution for World Society," Constellations, 15:4 (2008).

[6] See Jeffrey Flynn, "Human Rights, Transnational Solidarity, and Duties to the Global Poor," Constellations 16:1 (2009).

[7] I want to thank the Fordham graduate students in my seminar on Habermas this past term for helpful discussion of numerous issues raised in this collection.