Between Two Worlds, East and West: An Autobiography

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Mohanty, J.N., Between Two Worlds, East and West: An Autobiography, Oxford, 2002, 224pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195648358.

Reviewed by Lester Embree , Florida Atlantic University


Hardly ever do philosophers write so fine (and concise) a story of how their years have gone. Most of us lack so much to look back on and few write so well.

Mohanty is now in his seventies (he was born in 1928). He grew up, studied, and began to teach in India, but in his twenties he went to Göttingen and then, after a while back in India, he spent over thirty years in the United States. Because he never committed to emigrating, he has always considered himself an Indian and never an Indian-American. From Germany on, Mohanty has always been conversant with both Eastern or Western cultures and has straddled both. He writes to explain his life in the West to readers in the East and vice versa. Beyond this, we can wonder why he went West, as well as asking what has interested him philosophically.

Much about Mohanty himself is indirectly indicated by his descriptions of places and others. There are a dozen short chapters relating to the situations he lived in. Although the following sketch is not up to his standard of expression, it may nevertheless draw colleagues into a fine reading experience and into a deeper grasp of a type of interworldly intellectual now increasingly encountered.

We are treated to loving descriptions of an extended family, some remarkable individuals—many of them women (we rarely read of men without reading of their wives)— and Mohanty’s village (he has always considered himself a village boy). His father belonged to the landed gentry, was a judge, and always supported him with whatever was needed, but he was emotionally closer to his mother. His home language is Oriya; he went to government English schools during the Raj and had tutors, receiving firsts and prizes from the beginning. He also began learning Sanskrit at home: “Every morning three of us would recite conjugations and declensions of Sanskrit verbs and nouns loud enough to be heard outside the house; we would compete to do it first. The pandit taught me all the grammar that I learned later. He also taught this ten-year-old boy the primer of logic Tarkasamgraha, and Kalidasa’s Raghuvamsam” (6).

Born when he was, Mohanty lived through the culmination of India’s independence struggle. Some aunts and uncles followed Gandhi and were at one time jailed, while others were Marxist and went underground. Police came around. The alternatives of Marx and Gandhi were debated by Mohanty within himself as well as with others through most of his life. An uncle sought to merge Gandhi, Marx, and Tagore. Ramakrishna and Vivekananda were also discussed in a time Mohanty compares with Periclean Greece and the 1781-1832 period in Germany. Gandhi seems to have affected him most:

Earlier in my youth, I spun on a spinning wheel—following the Mahatma’s example—and used only hand-spun and hand-woven clothes, practiced vegetarianism, walked, if not on bare feet, with a locally made pair of sandals, said, when possible, the evening prayers for all major religions, read and memorized large parts of the Bhagavadgita, washed my own dishes after meals (this was not usually done in middle-class families in India), and tried to cultivate a spirit of empathy with nature and my fellow villagers. It was a way of life—where religion, social activism, and ethical spirit merged together. After finishing high school, I was spending the summer in the village, translating Tagore’s poems (originally in Bengali) into Oriya, when I decided to learn tilling the land with a bullock-drawn plough, as was the practice then (and also now). It was hard work, but I wanted to experience what work in the field meant. (17)

First, he went locally to college to study mathematics, Sanskrit, and English. He abandoned his initial attempt to read Kant, but began his preoccupation with the writings of Sri Aurobindo. In 1945, after coming in first on examinations, he went on to Presidency College in Calcutta. Academic life may bring little pay in India, but many statuses and titles are mentioned. About that city and time, he much later spoke in a lecture of “a sixteen-year-old boy from the neighboring state of Orissa coming to Calcutta, carrying an insatiable curiosity to learn and to make friends and immediately falling in love with the city” (102).

While at Presidency he helped defend the residence buildings with stones, boiling water, and live electric wires during the communal conflicts over partition. Otherwise, “my central philosophical concern was: ’Are the world and finite individuals real even from the point of view of the highest metaphysical knowledge, as Sri Aurobindo would have it, or is the world, along with finite individuals, only an appearance, mithya, sustained by ignorance (avidya) of the ultimate reality, as Samkara holds” (27). Many teachers and fellow students are remembered fondly. He was among the first graduates in independent India, receiving his first-class degree in 1949. He then did some teaching on Sri Aurobindo, studied Vedanta at the Sanskrit College, and fell in love and married.

Mohanty went to Göttingen in October 1952 and stayed two and a half years. We are not told why he chose that university, but it was staffed by top faculty trained before the war. The reader still senses his thrill half a century later. With funding from his father, he left behind parents, wife, and child for an intellectually exciting situation (which was gone when he returned there in the 1990s). He continued to study mathematics (no doubt also German) and Sanskrit, in the latter working on the Vedas in a way that seems indelibly stamped in his memory:

Our task was to translate [a hymn] into German, point out and resolve problems in translations, identify grammatical problems, and solve them with the help of Panini as well as other Vedic grammars. “Never use,” he warned us, “any existing translations, never use Sayana’s commentary (for, he said, Sayana is closer to us in time than to the Vedic period); use dictionaries, especially nirukta and grammar books, and prepare your own translations and report.” And when you presented yours in the class, Waldschmidt would critique you, question you at every step, and tear your arduous work to pieces. He once said to the class, “My goal is to train you in such a way that given a fragment of a manuscript, you can make something of it, date, build a reasonable hypothesis about its style, internal and external cross-references, produce a translation, and raise a host of questions.” And in all this, he remained a philologist—an excellent one at that—with no interest in the value and validity of the ideas, concepts, or philosophies in the texts. That was German Indology at its best. (44)

Few philosophers in the United States know that Mohanty is also a world-class Sanskritologist.

There are good discussions of the physicists who delayed progress on the German nuclear bomb, the involvements of various figures with National Socialism, and the first comment on Heidegger, “who never even regretted his ’political error’ but always came up with devious ’ontological’ explanations!” (43; cf. 114) In contrast, “Politically conservative though he was, Husserl did not fall into the trap, and as a result suffered indignity because of his Jewish heritage, at the hands of his hand-picked successor” (54).

Back in India, Mohanty joined the land-gift movement of Gandhi’s foremost disciple, Vinoba Bhave, discussing with him the Isa, Kena, and Katha Upanishads as they walked from village to village. Later he translated and commented on some lectures of Vinoba. In 1955 he became a lecturer at Calcutta in a delightful way too elaborate to explain here. His Western degree was valued and his network of friends was growing. He used Sanskrit texts to teach Indian philosophy and Kröner’s Vom Kant bis Hegel for German philosophy. His own Husserl’s Theory of Meaning and Phenomenology and Ontology stemmed in part from his subsequent lectures on epistemology. Later he lectured on political philosophy using Hegel and Marx. Still later, he also helped establish the philosophy department at Burdwan University, to which he commuted from Calcutta for six years, after which he returned to the University of Calcutta.

Yet the Calcutta department was no longer exciting. He did not want to be the chair, particularly with the challenges of the Maoist Naxolite movement, and accepted the invitation to the University of Oklahoma and the small town of Norman. Initially, the plan was to visit merely for two years. Being there longer brought him into contact with something called “Indian culture”:

This was more due to “homesickness” and boredom than due to the love for and understanding of that culture. If I look at it with the eyes of young children who were growing up, in high schools or in colleges, “Indian culture,” for their parents, meant a certain taste in food, music (mostly film songs), Bhajan (religious songs), and certain religious rituals. A young person is said to be “Americanized” if he prefers to eat hamburgers, prefers Western music, and does not understand the Bahjan or puja [religious rituals]. For many parents, cultivating Indian culture, including religious ceremonies, was meant for en-culturing the children, and the latter need this so that they, when they grew up, do not marry American girls (or boys). “Understanding” the culture was of no concern to anyone, for no one understood all that, in any case. This perhaps explains why the children in the beginning accompanied their parents to feasts and festivals, but eventually gave up. (81, but cf. 101)

Oklahoma and Norman were also not that exciting, so in 1973 Mohanty accepted the invitation to visit the Graduate Faculty of Political and Social Science of the New School for Social Research—an invitation that came from Aron Gurwitsch, who hoped to find a successor. Like Calcutta, New York is a real city, and Mohanty appreciated how the Graduate Faculty was established by refugees. He and Gurwitsch had too much in common for extensive influence and, in any case, Gurwitsch soon died. But Hans Jonas and especially Hannah Arendt did influence him, the latter proposing that he distinguish Heidegger the thinker from Heidegger the man. While at the New School, Mohanty came to appreciate the early Marx as well as to appreciate history, and, as he once told the present writer, he became a transcendental philosopher there. He also led the struggle to preserve the New School’s Ph.D. program in philosophy. He went back to Oklahoma in 1978.

In 1982 Mohanty was a visiting fellow at All Souls, Oxford, and used the Sanskrit resources there in order to advance the preparation of Reason and Tradition in Indian Thought. Among other things, he got Michael Dummett started on an intensive study of Husserl. In 1994 he spent a summer at Freiburg to read Husserl manuscripts (I still hope he can finish his Gesamtdarstellung of the phenomenologist.) He offers a charming comparison of Oxford and Freiburg.

In 1985, after seven more years in Norman, Mohanty retired from Oklahoma and accepted Joe Margolis’s call to Temple. Reason and Tradition in Indian Thought was finished in 1990. (He also visited Emory repeatedly in the 1990s.) He saw his granddaughter, Padmini (whom he once told colleagues at dinner that he had taken to a rock concert, not an easy place to imagine him!), through high school and then Bryn Mawr: “I had so long carefully guarded her and protected her, now she could go her own way, making her own choices” (103).

Meanwhile, however, the need to return again and again to India was strong. While his papers in the West were of a scholarly and scientific type, in India he sought a more practical impact: “But a merely scholarly, ’scientific’ philosophy had never captured my mind. The old interests of my youth—Gandhi and Sri Aurobindo—were not totally gone. Like Kant, I continued to believe that philosophy had to be, in spite of its scientific character, a theory of Welt Weisheit and Husserl’s idea that the philosopher had to be a ’functionary’ of humankind did not cease to appeal to me” (106).

Concerning India today, however, he has misgivings about the new and Americanizing middle class there, and especially about renunciations of Gandhi, as well as about those who say that the conservative BJP party shows the way back to the ideology of Hindutva. “The ideologists of Hindutva are not believers in Hinduism” (108). The last chapter affectingly describes how, even though he is an atheist, he performed the final rituals for his mother’s ashes. One can be spiritual without being theistic.

Once I clearly and unambiguously rejected belief in God, the idea of spirituality, despite its equivocations and ambiguities, became more interesting. Philosophy, as a search for the transcendental ground of mundaneity, began to make sense. I also attempted to recover the sense of religiosity that was important for me. Religiosity now meant to me a sensitivity to the irreducible sacredness of things; the sacredness of life; sacredness of humanity; and the sacredness of nature; the moral responsibility to preserve life, nature and humankind, to let humans flourish and develop to their best ability—in brief, using Whitehead’s expression, “world-loyalty.” (120)

In the penultimate chapter he describes in a few rich paragraphs (and not without some bitterness) the United States he has seen over the past forty years and the new society that seems to be emerging there. He disapproves of Germany becoming a multicultural society like the United States. He had found that he could send down roots in Germany as well as India, but not in America. He is nevertheless grateful to have been able to participate in the vibrant American intellectual life.

And the antepenultimate chapter and the appendix are about his philosophical journey and contribution. Mohanty asserts that “my life has been primarily dedicated to the pursuit of philosophical ideas” (ix) and there is no reason to doubt his self-understanding. Here we can return to the questions posed at the beginning, i.e., What interested him philosophically? answering them in the light of remarks throughout the text. He does not remember what initially lead him to philosophy, but the interest in Western as well as Indian philosophy emerged early. Kant is often in the background for him. He acknowledges a proclivity for analytical thinking. Besides the philosophy of logic and mathematics already studied in India, there was the Gandhi vs. Marx issue and also Sri Aurobindo in social and political philosophy. Since at least Göttingen, where he jumped into the controversy of consciousness vs. language, the problem of Platonism—or at least the status of abstract or ideal objects—has been central, and thus he resisted empiricism and historicism, as well as “the growing anti-Platonism of analytic thinkers in England and America” (111). Thereafter he proceeded from both Western and Indian philosophy.

Husserl, beginning from the Logical Investigations, is focal for Mohanty. “Phenomenology asks us to focus on the way things are presented in consciousness, on the meanings that things have for those experiencing consciousness. Understanding consciousness as intentional and meaning-giving, phenomenology raised consciousness, in its transcendental (i.e., world-constituting) role, as the foundational principle for philosophy” (112). At Temple he was concerned to respond to the post-modern critique of Husserl. He wanted to mediate between Continental and analytic philosophy. And he would have liked to have modeled a work on the late Husserl. “Singularly free from Hegel’s ’Absolutism,’ with a sense for the open-endedness of the march of the human spirit—unfortunately still caught up in the ’Eurocentrism’ of Hegel—Husserl showed the way. Blending Hegel and Husserl, bringing in our knowledge of Oriental and African experiences, I thought I could write a new Phenomenology” (115).

And why did Mohanty come to the West? Going West to study and practice philosophy is certainly understandable as a combination of motivation and opportunity. He left parents, wife, and child in order to learn in the exciting Göttingen; the invitation from Oklahoma came at a good time; the call to the New School was also opportune; his research projects for Oxford and Freiburg are clear; and he went to Temple “for a more intellectual climate” (99). What stands out throughout, however, is that he did not come West to immigrate, but in order to do some research. And ultimately, when he was freed from theism and materialism, he felt “free to think” (120).1


1. There is a concise and factual “Self Presentation” that complements this book in minor respects and also a bibliography up to then in Phenomenology: East and West, Essays in Honor of J.N. Mohanty, ed. Frank M. Churchland and D.P. Chattopadhyaya (Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1993).