Between Word and Image: Heidegger, Klee, and Gadamer on Gesture and Genesis

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Dennis J. Schmidt, Between Word and Image: Heidegger, Klee, and Gadamer on Gesture and Genesis, Indiana University Press, 2013, 187pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253006202.

Reviewed by Kathleen Wright, Haverford College


Imagine a round table discussion on the paintings and writings of the Swiss-German, Paul Klee (1879-1940). This invitation-only symposium would bring together the following twentieth century Continental philosophers and critics to talk together about how their theories were individually influenced by Klee: Adorno, Bataille, Benjamin, Deleuze, Derrida, Foucault, Gadamer, Heidegger, Klossowski, Lyotard, Merleau-Ponty, and Sartre. What might be the outcome of this hypothetical symposium? Based only on their analyses of Klee, we might discover that these philosophers and critics will find themselves in agreement with others in ways that we would not expect, for example, Adorno in agreement with Merleau-Ponty, Gadamer with Benjamin, and Heidegger with Deleuze.[1] Or we might find that even though they all agree that Klee poses a fundamental and philosophical question about how to think the painted image in modern abstract art, none of them has the answer to this question. Whereas the first outcome of our hypothetical symposium would lead us to theorize about the relationship between these contemporary philosophical and critical theories, the second outcome would leave us instead stuck with and struck by the philosophical task of thinking the painted image in contemporary art that we encounter in an exemplary way in the paintings of Paul Klee. Dennis J. Schmidt assumes something like the second outcome of our hypothetical symposium in Between Word and Image. Accordingly for him the task of philosophy, and here philosophy is presumed to be Continental philosophy, is to turn itself into the kind of thinking that can meet the challenge posed by contemporary art (109).

Schmidt limits his study, wisely, to Heidegger and Gadamer, for we gain insight into what Gadamer and his teacher, Heidegger, have in common that is unavailable without the perspective of these two philosophers' connection to Klee. However, the particularity of this perspective also appears to cause Schmidt to minimize an important difference between Gadamer and Heidegger. As long as Heidegger's question about Klee is taken to inform Gadamer's interest in painting and in Klee, Gadamer's hermeneutics serves primarily to advance Heidegger's agenda that metaphysics, here the metaphysical concept of image, be overcome so that a new form of thinking not dominated by metaphysical concepts can begin. However, what Gadamer calls understanding (Verstehen) is decidedly not a new form of thinking based on the painted image rather than the word. In fact, Gadamer's hermeneutics is not about new philosophical beginnings at all.

This short book begins with an introduction, "The Genesis of the Question," followed by three chapters, "Unfolding the Question: An Excentric History," "Heidegger and Klee: An Attempt at a New Beginning," and "On Word, Image, and Gesture: Another Attempt at a Beginning." It ends with an afterword, "The Question of Genesis for Now." It also includes eleven works by Klee reproduced in black and white. The introduction is about the "four sets of questions [that] gave birth and shape to this book" (1). The first question concerns the relation between Heidegger and Klee, the second the relation between word and image, the third the relation between art and truth, and the fourth about the ethical significance of the work of art today. Thus, this book is dedicated to significant and serious philosophical questions.

The first question about Heidegger's relation to Klee is the one that, according to Schmidt, propelled him to write this book. This question, he tells us, was occasioned by the publication of Heidegger's "Notes on Klee"[2] in 1993 and by remarks Heidegger is reported to have made about Klee by his old friend, Heinrich Wiegand Petzet[3] in 1983 and by the philosopher Otto Pöggeler[4] in 1982 and 2002. The existence of a significant but unpublished work by Heidegger on Klee had long been rumored ever since Petzet reported that Heidegger spoke enthusiastically after attending an exhibition of eighty-eight paintings by Klee in Basle in 1956 about writing a second part on modern art for "The Origin of the Work of Art," an essay written in 1935. The examples that Heidegger had considered in 1935 were all works of art of the past, such as the Greek temples at Paestum and van Gogh's "A Pair of Peasant Shoes." In 1956, Heidegger confronted something new in the paintings by Klee. As he wrote to his friend, Petzet, in 1959, "Something which we all have not yet even glimpsed has come forward in [Klee's works]."[5] However, Heidegger never published anything on Klee during his lifetime. Nor did he add anything influenced by Klee to the ending of "The Origin of the Work of Art" when he republished it in 1960. Nonetheless the expectation remained of there being something substantial on Klee among Heidegger's unpublished manuscripts.

These expectations proved false when Günter Seubold published Heidegger's writings on Klee in 1993, for these in no way amount to a substantial "unpublished work" on Klee or even to the basis for a lecture on Klee Heidegger is reported to have given to architects in Freiburg in 1956. Heidegger's hitherto unpublished writings on Klee are instead "notes" written on seventeen slips of paper, some the size of large index cards, others smaller, and in no discernible order.[6] In regard to content, Heidegger's "Notes on Klee" comprise (a) ten excerpts or paraphrases from Klee's writings about art, (b) titles of ten paintings by Klee some with sketches, and (c) Heidegger's attempt to interpret the above. Seubold tentatively organizes Heidegger's interpretations (c) into five sections: (1) The relation to the artwork essay from 1935/36; past art; (2) contemporary art; (3) The unique position of Klee: pictoriality (Bildsamkeit), bringing-forth; relation to Cézanne and East Asian "art"; (4) The transformation (Wandel) of art; and (5) The context of [Heidegger's] late philosophy: the event, saying, the voice of stillness.[7]

Even though Heidegger's fascination with Klee after viewing his paintings in Basle lasted, as far as we can tell, no more than four years (1956-1960), Schmidt makes much of Heidegger's "Notes on Klee" along with his reported remarks about Klee:

The impact upon Heidegger of discovering Klee's paintings and of reading his theoretical writings was great, and the consequences of this discovery were not simply to confirm Heidegger's own views but to change them. Indeed, Heidegger's acknowledgment of Klee's accomplishments constituted a reversal of his earlier sweeping condemnation of modern art as nothing more than the reflex of a technologically defined world. (1)

Indeed, Schmidt even compares Heidegger's brief relation to Klee to Heidegger's lifelong relation to the poet, Friedrich Hölderlin (1770-1853):

Just as Heidegger had found in Friedrich Hölderlin his poet, so too was it the case that during the years of his engagement with Klee he found his painter. Importantly, both Hölderlin and Klee were artists who were capable of theorizing the achievement of the work of art from out of the experience of that work. (1)[8]

If Hölderlin became Heidegger's source in the 1930s for "poetic thinking," a new and altogether different kind of thinking that did not aim at or end in a concept, Klee, on Schmidt's account, presented Heidegger in 1956 with the possibility of a "pictorial" or "visual thinking," another kind of non-conceptual thinking that begins and ends with the painted image.

Schmidt does not explore why Heidegger, influenced by Klee, fails to add a second part on modern art to "The Origin of the Work of Art" when he republished it in 1960 or why Heidegger does not take up the possibility of another kind of pictorial or visual thinking that Klee's paintings and written works opened up to him in 1956. Instead Schmidt turns to Heidegger's former student, Gadamer, in the belief that "Gadamer's Truth and Method develops many of the lines of investigation and possibilities that Heidegger himself abandons" (108). Indeed, Heidegger's publication of "The Origin of the Work of Art" in the popular Reclam edition in 1960 contains a substantial introduction written by Gadamer, who also published Truth and Method that same year. Schmidt's contention that Truth and Method takes up Klee's challenge to the dominance of conceptual thinking explains Schmidt's additional claim that Gadamer's "hermeneutics takes the task of understanding the work of art as its primary concern" (24; emphasis added).[9] Where chapter two on Heidegger and Klee is subtitled "An Attempt at a New Beginning," chapter three on Gadamer and modern art, including Klee, is subtitled "Another Attempt at a Beginning."

Chapter one is, however, problematic. Its aim is to "unfold the question" of the image so that the reader will understand why there needs to be the beginning of a new kind of thinking (or Continental philosophical thinking) in the first place. For it "is necessary," Schmidt tells us, "to understand that the question of the image is not simply a question for [Continental] philosophy but rather a question that goes straight to the heart of the very possibility and idea of [Continental] philosophy" (13; see also 107). After a series of disparate preliminary observations, Schmidt begins to "unfold the question" by means of what he calls an "excentric" history, presumably because it is a history of something normally considered peripheral, namely, "philosophical reflections on painting and the image" (29), and not the more typical history of philosophy that focuses on metaphysics. The first two stages of this three-stage history concern "pivotal moments," thanks to Plato and Kant. The narrative that Schmidt tells about Plato and Kant is, however, essentially the same story that we find in Heidegger's books on Plato and Kant. This becomes explicit when Schmidt discusses stage two on Kant by simply importing Heidegger's discussion of Kant's first and third Critiques since "Heidegger's reading of Kant . . . [on schematism] uncovers the full force of the Kantian recovery of the image for philosophy" (31). Schmidt presumes, I think unwisely, that all Continental philosophers accept without question Heidegger's A edition account of Kant's first Critique and thus will find stage two of his excentric history convincing.

The third stage in this excentric history is even more problematic. This stage begins in 1889, when painting undergoes a series of revolutions. Based on the undeniable fact that "Non-objective, non-representational, abstract painting completely changed the questions raised by painting" (46), Schmidt goes on to draw the following questionable conclusion about Heidegger:

By the time Klee takes up the topic of modern art in his celebrated lecture of 1924, and by the time Heidegger writes "The Origin of the Work of Art" in 1935, finding an orientation to modern painting required starting out from ways of thinking that were as new, revolutionary, and radical as was exhibited by such works of art. (46)

The problem with this conclusion at the end of the excentric history presented in chapter one is that it suggests that Heidegger is of one mind with Klee about modern art in 1935. However, as we have seen, Heidegger completely rejected modern art in 1935 when he composed "The Origin of the Work of Art" and was challenged only, and then only briefly, by Klee's paintings and theoretical writings in 1956. Nonetheless chapter two on Heidegger and Klee begins with Heidegger's 1935 essay.

For me, what is most intriguing about this book only emerges when one can put aside two things. The first is the philosophical framework of Heidegger's history of metaphysics with its "excentric" counterpart, the history of philosophical reflections on painting and the image. The second is the idea that Truth and Method is primarily to be understood as picking up where Heidegger left off in 1960. For Schmidt is most insightful and compelling when he allows himself to think not about what Heidegger would think or about what Gadamer does think about Klee and modern art but about what he himself thinks on his own about genesis and gesture in the painted image. In this book, Schmidt has allowed one of the four sets of questions "that gave birth and shape to this book" to dominate his thinking for the most part, namely, the first question about the relation between Heidegger and Klee. However, when he lets himself respond to the other three sets of questions, the relation between word and image, the relation between art and truth, and the ethical significance of the work of art today, he shows us that thinking can meet the challenge that Klee's paintings pose to metaphysical conceptions of the image. Perhaps most intriguing, however, is what Schmidt hints at but does not develop in detail about the relation between painting and writing in Klee (4, 99, and 135). Here Schmidt can be more expansive so that writing (écriture) also includes writing poetry,[10] writing music,[11] painting pictorial writing,[12] painting polyphonically,[13] and calligraphy.[14] This extension of the meaning of "writing" then raises another question: What kind of thinking, then, is "composing," be the end product a poem, a musical composition, a painting with and of writing, polyphonic painting or calligraphy?

[1] See Stephen H. Watson, Crescent Moon over the Rational: Philosophical Interpretations of Paul Klee  (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2009): 2.

[2] See Günther Seubold, "Heideggers nachgelassene Klee-Notizen" in Heidegger Studies, 9 (1993): 5-12.

[3] See Heinrich Wiegand Petzet, Auf einen Stern zugehen: Begegnungen mit Martin Heidegger 1929-1976 (Frankfurt: Societäts Verlag, 1983).

[4] See Otto Pöggeler, "Neue Wege mit Heidegger," in Philosophische Rundschau 29 (1982): 39-71 and Bild und Technik: Heidegger, Klee, und die Moderne Kunst (Munich: Wilhelm Fink Verlag, 2002).

[5] Schmidt (p. 1) quoting Petzet, quoting Heidegger from a letter dated February 21, 1959.

[6] See Seubold, 1993: 7.

[7] See Seubold, 1993: 10-12.

[8] See Pöggeler, 2002: 129: "Thus Klee painted the task of the painter just as Hölderlin composed the mode of being (Wesen) of poetry."

[9] If this were the case, then the relevance of Aristotle's phronesis and the significance of legal hermeneutics for Gadamer's hermeneutics are hard to explain. See Hans-Georg Gadamer, Truth and Method, 2nd rev. ed. (London/New York: Continuum, 2004): 310-36.

[10] In 1956, Georg Schmidt characterized Klee as the "most poetic painter in our century and beyond (quoted in Pöggeler, 2002: 138)."

[11] See Hajo Düchting, Paul Klee: Painting and Music (Munich/New York: Prestel, 1997): 7: "There is hardly a twentieth-century painter and draughtsman who dealt so intensively with music as did Paul Klee, making explicit reference to it in both his art and his writings."

[12] K. Porter Aichele, Paul Klee's Pictorial Writing (Cambridge: Cambridge University, 2002).

[13] See Düchting, 1997: 65-79.

[14] See Aichele, 2002: 72, 75, 180-3, and 197; see also Michael Sullivan, The Three Perfections: Chinese Painting, Poetry, and Calligraphy (New York: G. Braziller, 1980).