Beyond Art

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Dominic McIver Lopes, Beyond Art, Oxford University Press, 2014, 224pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780198748083.

Reviewed by David Davies, McGill University


In this richly argued and challenging book, Dominic McIver Lopes offers both a diagnosis of our current situation in the philosophy of art and a prescription for future progress. The diagnosis traces the historical path that has led us to our current preoccupation with developing a theory of art and to a consequent theoretical impasse. The prescription is that we 'change the subject' by asking different questions from the ones that have dominated philosophical reflection on art over the past two and a half centuries. By asking different questions within a different framework, Lopes maintains, we can better satisfy the interests that led us to philosophise about art in the first place.

Lopes distinguishes three kinds of theories that might be offered in response to the question 'what is art?': (i) a theory of art outlining the conditions under which something is a work of art; (ii) a theory of the arts stating what makes certain activities arts when others are not, and (iii) theories of individual arts which state, for a given art, what makes any item a work in that art. He maintains that a failure to clearly distinguish these enterprises explains the widespread conviction that theories of the individual arts must be grounded in adequate theories of art or theories of the arts.

In Lopes's historical narrative, philosophical reflection on the question 'what is art' begins with the mid-18th century identification of 'the modern system of the arts' and the consequent interest in determining the distinctive features of those enterprises that are arts, where a work of art is an artifact produced within such an enterprise. But, in the 20th century, 'hard cases' seem to challenge such substantive theories of the arts. Hard cases -- cases "whose status as art is controversial from a theoretical perspective" (6), such as Robert Barry's Inert Gas Series -- are puzzling for the view that a work of art is just a product of an art because they present themselves as 'free agents' that belong to no particular art. To explain how such things can be artworks, we seem to need a theory of art. But, Lopes maintains, this leads to a theoretical impasse. Since the hard cases are by definition ones whose artistic status is contested, 'traditional theorists' -- who take the possession of some exhibited feature or disjunction of exhibited features to be necessary for something to be a work of art -- can deny that the hard cases are works of art, while 'genetic theorists' -- who take some genetic feature to be sufficient for being a work of art -- can insist that they are and use them to discredit traditional theories. This stalemate is vicious because there is a parallel methodological disagreement as to the criteria according to which a theory of art should be assessed.

Lopes proposes that our philosophical interests in art are better served overall by 'passing the buck' from theory of art to either theory of the arts or theories of the individual arts. He further claims that the buck must be passed to the latter since there are good reasons to doubt whether an informative and viable theory of the arts will be forthcoming. Theories of the individual arts can be developed on the basis of evidence as to the nature of our artistic practices furnished by art historians, sociologists of art, psychologists and cognitive scientists. Our best theories of the individual arts will be those that make best sense of our art practices as those practices are described as a result of our best empirical inquiries. In spite of the relative infancy of empirical art studies, we can still hope to make progress by 'reverse engineering' from the nature of our appreciative practices to the nature of the things thereby appreciated. But we should not require or expect that such theories will be unified by an overarching theory of art or theory of the arts.

According to Lopes's 'buck passing' theory of art, "x is a work of art = x is a work of K, where K is an art" (14). This is contrasted with substantive 'buck stopping' theories of art, whether traditional or genetic. The buck passing theory faces two challenges. First, it must be 'viable', that is, extensionally adequate. Since it states that something is an artwork just in case it is a work in a particular art, it must address two sorts of counter-example:

(a) entities that appear to be works in a particular art but not works of art -- for example, an ordinary coffee mug, surely not an artwork, is a work in ceramics, where ceramics seems to be an art, and

(b) entities that are works of art but do not seem to be works in any particular art -- Lopes terms these 'free agents.'

Second, the theory must be more 'informative' than buck stopping theories in speaking to our philosophical and practical interests in and concerns about the arts.

In arguing for the superior informativeness of the buck passing theory, Lopes first maintains that no theory of art, buck passing or buck stopping, can yield informative theories of the arts or of the individual arts. The buck passing theory obviously cannot because its content derives from those theories of the arts or of individual arts to which the buck is passed. But, Lopes argues, buck stopping theories do no better since they say nothing about the differentiating features of the individual arts and how they might satisfy the requirements of a given buck stopping theory. The informative superiority of the buck passing theory consists in its ability to speak to three other kinds of interests motivating traditional theories of art:

(i) providing conceptual foundations for empirical art studies -- Lopes argues that such studies are always of particular arts rather than of art in general;

(ii) grounding art criticism -- Lopes argues that the notion of a generic 'artistic value' is a myth, and the values entering into the proper appreciation of artworks are either aesthetic -- an innovative account of aesthetic value is outlined in chapter 9 -- or specific to the individual arts; and

(iii) enabling us to deal adequately with the hard cases.

Lopes defends the viability of the buck passing theory by providing, in three stages, a framework for developing theories of the individual arts. First, he locates the arts in a larger collection of practices whose products are 'appreciative kinds', kinds whose natures have implications for how their instances are to be evaluated. Second, we can distinguish practices issuing in appreciative kinds in terms of their 'medium profile', where a medium is a resource taken together with techniques for using it to produce tokens of the relevant kind. Third, we must locate the kind in the context of what Lopes terms an 'appreciative practice' whose norms are centred on a medium profile. Such a practice relates those tokens with a given medium profile that are artworks to various norms that ground the ascription of relevant aesthetic and art-specific values to those tokens. The latter furnishes an answer to the 'coffee mug' objection: while an ordinary coffee mug may share its medium profile with a ceramic artwork, it originates in a different appreciative practice. The framework also allows us to answer the 'free agent' objection. Many works that are presented as potential free agents are best seen as belonging to a new art, 'conceptual art', whose medium profile is language and ideas and whose appreciative practices distinguish it from non-artistic uses of language and ideas. Finally, passing the buck also deals better with 'hard cases'. What puzzles us about such cases, Lopes maintains, is not so much their qualifications as art per se but rather their qualifications as belonging to a particular art. A hard case is art insofar as it meets the conditions for being a work in a particular art.

The foregoing summary does scant justice to the rich detail of Lopes's highly original and important book and the carefully reasoned sub-structure of its argument. The book furnishes philosophers of art with a new and potentially more productive focus and framework for inquiry. Also, in holding theories of the individual arts accountable to empirical study of our artistic practices, it speaks to those favouring the 'empirical turn' in aesthetics. Lopes undoubtedly achieves his professed principal aim (159), namely, alerting philosophers of art to the significance of distinguishing the different philosophical enterprises that march under the 'what is art?' banner. But devotees of those buck stopping strategies that we are urged to forsake may, I think, have some residual concerns. Let me sketch two of these.

1. Consider the proposed answer to the 'coffee mug' objection: while an ordinary coffee mug and a piece of ceramic art may share their medium profile, they belong to different appreciative practices. Lopes rejects as fallacious the objection that this presupposes some criteria identifying one of these practices as an art practice. This would assign to theories of the individual arts a task that belongs to theory of the arts. Indeed, the whole point of the proposed framework for developing theories of the individual arts is to counter such a conflation of tasks. But, as noted, Lopes doesn't think the prospects for a viable and informative theory of the arts are good. There are two reasons for this pessimism: (a) in augmenting the 18th century 'system of the arts,' he argues, we have proceeded on a local basis, comparing new candidates with other existing arts rather than appealing to a general theory of the arts, and (b) it may well be purely contingent which appreciative kinds we count as arts. All theories of the individual arts can do, therefore, is to determine the medium profile and appreciative practices of those appreciative kinds we happen to regard as arts. Our intuitive conception of the art kinds is indeed open to correction in light of empirical study -- as Lopes puts it, 'the K's [arts] are up for grabs' (130). But this pertains to the most illuminating ways of grouping the things in those appreciative kinds the folk regard as arts. More generally, Lopes rejects any attempts to identify the specifically artistic appreciative practices by reference to (a) their promoting generic artistic values (for Lopes, there is only aesthetic value and the values specific to particular arts) or (b) their enabling the articulation of specifically artistic properties or the realization of specifically artistic achievements, which would require a buck stopping theory of art.

Suppose this is right. Then even if we find a practice in another culture falling outside our own historical tradition that shares with one of our arts both a medium profile and an appreciative practice, this is by itself no reason to think that this practice is artistic for that culture. Unless we are happy with what Lopes terms the 'parochial' idea that arts in other cultures must be our arts -- must be the same combinations of medium profile and appreciative practice that we regard as arts -- we have no way of implementing what Lopes terms the 'local' view of such matters: (w) x is a work of art in w if and only if x is a work of K in w and K is an art in w (79-81). For, again, if the relationship between being an art and having this combination of medium profile and appreciative practice is merely contingent -- i.e. the latter doesn't explain the former -- then the occurrence of this combination in another culture provides no good (non-parochial) reason for viewing this as an art in that culture. More significantly, it is very unlikely that we shall find 'twins' for our arts in other cultures. Lopes's framework for developing theories of the individual arts furnishes us with no principled (non-parochial) basis for deciding if practices in other cultures or traditions are arts. Appealing, as Lopes does, to empirical findings doesn't seem an option in this case -- presumably empirical researchers hope for some guidance from philosophers here rather than vice versa. The best we might hope for is a kind of parochially inflected localism: the arts in other cultures are those appreciative kinds that we decide to regard as arts by means of 'local' comparisons with those of our own appreciative kinds that we treat as arts.

Perhaps Lopes is correct in thinking that what we characterise as the arts are practices grouped for merely contingent reasons, in which case there are in fact no principled reasons to which we can appeal, other than the ones just canvassed, in deciding whether to classify artifacts in other cultures as artworks. But, since the hope of extending our understanding of art beyond our own culture surely is, or should be, one of the interests that has driven theory of art and theory of the arts, this represents a significant respect in which the buck passing theory fails to be informative. We might wonder whether, in light of this implication of his account, Lopes's rather peremptory dismissal (110-115) of 'neo-institutional' theories of the arts that suggest that the arts be identified in terms of the distinctive ways in which certain medium-centred practices enable the articulation of contents is premature.

2. A second worry is about where the buck stops once it is passed. As noted earlier, Lopes proposes that we deal with the 'free agent' problem by assigning putative free agents either to an existing art (as with Cage's 4'33", viewed as extending our conception of what musical art is) or to a new art, 'conceptual art'. He describes the latter as encompassing "readymades, performances, documentation, and word-based art made during the late 1960s and early 1970s" (196). These works, he maintains, can fit his model if we assume that "the core medium of conceptual art is something like language or a set of ideas, especially ideas about art (though there might be more to its complete medium profile)" (197-98).

For Lopes, the medium profile encompasses those resources whose exploitation in a work is linked by the norms of an appreciative practice to the proper appreciation of the work: it is this that distinguishes medium from mere means. It is arguable, however, that, while language and ideas play a crucial role in a lot of late modern art, many such works also depend crucially, and often quite subtly, upon their physical realizations and lend themselves better to analysis in terms of different complex media profiles in association with overlapping medium-centred appreciative practices. On such an analysis, they would belong to different 'arts' in Lopes's sense. Consider, for example, the different relationships between performance, video and photographic 'documentation', and ideas in the oeuvre of an artist like Vito Acconci. Grasping these different relationships is crucial to appreciating the different artistic values of those works (see my "Telling Pictures", in Peter Goldie and Elisabeth Schellekens (eds)., Philosophy and Conceptual Art (Oxford, 2007), 138-56.) Lopes's claim that many purported 'free agents' are works of conceptual art, however, requires that we treat the physical realizations of those works as mere means in order to preserve a unified medium profile for conceptual art. Furthermore, the use of innovative ways of 'specifying' late-modern pieces (Binkley) suggests that both medium profile and appreciative practice are more work-specific than the subsumption of all such works under the label 'conceptual art' would allow.

To what extent would it undermine the buck passing strategy to insist that the buck sometimes be passed even further, to those seeking to understand and appreciate the working of individual works? It might be said that, in those cases that Lopes wishes to classify as 'conceptual art', there is broad agreement in appreciative practices but that in few cases can the medium profile be identified with 'language and ideas' alone. What such works share is the use of some kind of vehicle, with a particular medium profile, to realize aesthetic and artistic values in virtue of a loosely specifiable appreciative practice shared with other late-modern works. Lopes's helpful schema clarifies how art works work (through a medium profile and a set of medium-centred appreciative practices), but many late-modern works are not helpfully thought of as belonging to 'conceptual art' in Lopes's sense. They are indeed not free agents since Lopes defines the latter as using only means and as having no medium profile and hence no medium-centred appreciative practices. Thus they are consistent with the buck passing theory if we take them to belong to a plurality of different idiosyncratic art kinds, some with only a single actual member.

In a number of places Lopes insists on the exploratory nature of his proposals, both substantive and methodological. In the same spirit, the two critical responses sketched here should be viewed as suggested refinements of Lopes's general model, although the first response suggests that we should continue to explore substantive ways of differentiating the appreciative practices in the arts from those outside. But it is one of the many virtues of Lopes's book that it opens up the conceptual space in which such issues can be more clearly formulated and debated.