Beyond Concepts: Unicepts, Language, and Natural Information

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Ruth Garrett Millikan, Beyond Concepts: Unicepts, Language, and Natural Information, Oxford University Press, 2017, 256 pp., $35.00, ISBN 9780198717195.

Reviewed by Andrea Onofri, University of Graz


In her previous work, Ruth Millikan has developed a highly influential and original account of cognition and language, applying contemporary evolutionary theory to a number of traditional philosophical problems. Her new book is based on the same methodological approach, addressing Kant's question "how is knowledge possible? . . . from a contemporary naturalist standpoint" (p. 3). Part One applies this perspective to the problem of cognition, while Part Two develops an account of information and of how cognitive systems extract such information from natural and intentional signs.

This book is a great philosophical achievement. The breadth and originality of Millikan's view are remarkable. She shows how a naturalistic approach can provide a fresh perspective on central philosophical puzzles and puts forward several new ideas that will engender lively debates. The systematic character of her work is especially impressive -- Millikan tackles many different themes, but the various components of her account fit together beautifully and mutually support each other. This book has much to offer to both those already familiar with her work and new readers. While many of its themes appeared in her previous works, Millikan here adds many innovations. Furthermore, the book will help the expert reader who wants to understand the connections between various elements of her system. For those unfamiliar with Millikan's work, the book is a very good entry point -- the reader can look at her previous writings to learn more about specific topics. This is a challenging work to be read carefully, and some previous knowledge of central themes in philosophy of mind and language is recommended. It will thus be an excellent resource for researchers in this area, advanced undergraduate/graduate students and interested readers with sufficient background knowledge.

I cannot do justice here to Millikan's rich theory by offering a detailed summary. I will limit myself to a brief overview of some salient aspects and then raise a challenge for one of her core theses.

Chapter 1 begins with a general metaphysical picture of the world. Cognition is possible because we live in a "clumpy world" (11) where objects form "clumps" -- for instance, rabbits and Gothic cathedrals form distinct clumps. Each clump presents properties that are uncommon among non-members and common among members, so an object's instantiating certain properties reliably indicates whether it is in a clump or not. We can thus identify newly encountered members of each clump, gathering more knowledge about that clump and then extending this knowledge through induction. The same applies to individuals, which can be seen as clumps of time stages.

Chapter 2 argues that "names" for clumps refer "directly", "not through a description recognized by all users." (32) If names were descriptive, identifying the source of the linguistic information received (e.g. through the name "cat") would require knowing a specific description. However, there are many ways of identifying a name's reference -- Jill could recognize incoming information about cats simply by recognizing the word "cat", Jane's description of cats could be based on vision, Helen Keller could recognize them by touch (see figure 7.1, p. 100). So knowing a specific description is not required.

In Chapter 3 Millikan introduces "unitrackers" and "unicepts". Any cognitive system receives a wide variety of sensory stimulations and must recognize which of them are caused by the same individual or kind. Without this ability, gathered information cannot be applied. For instance, suppose I see a lion out of its cage and then hear from its roar that it is angry. To infer that that is an angry lion out of its cage, I must first recognize that the pieces of information gathered through perception all originated from the same object.

The function of unitrackers and unicepts is to recognize and store incoming information as being about the same:

A unitracker for a thing takes in a diversity of proximal stimulations over time and interprets or translates them as signs carrying information about one and the same thing . . . It funnels . . . information about the same into immediate use or into storage in a way that marks it as all concerning the same. It does this by employing always the same unicept in using or storing these packets of information . . . (43)

A unitracker is a faculty which performs its function of "same-tracking" in many different ways -- think of all the ways you can recognize a family member. Concerning the nature of unicepts, Millikan seems to oscillate between different positions. On p. 7 she says a unicept is a "link connecting stored information about the same thing together". On p. 43 (fn. 1) she says unicepts are "faculties" or "systems". In a number of other passages she simply treats unicepts as components of intentional attitudes, and this seems to be her preferred construal (see 8, fn. 1 p. 43, 44, 46, 47, figure 3.1 p. 50, 67, 71, 224, 225.)

One of the book's main theses -- reflected in the title -- is that unicepts replace traditional concepts: "there are no such things as empirical concepts." (49) Let us summarize some of Millikan's arguments for this radical claim. While concepts are supposed to be shared, unitrackers and unicepts are not -- different individuals re-identify the same object in different ways and form different links between their unicepts. Furthermore, concepts cannot be redundant, inadequate or confused. Chapter 6 illustrates various ways in which unitrackers/unicepts can fail to perform their functions: when a unitracker mistakes information that is not about target T as information about T, this results in false belief; unitrackers can be redundant (consider the "Hesperus"- and "Phosphorus"-unitrackers that the ancients had for Venus); unicepts can be equivocal (consider someone transferred to Twin-Earth whose "water"-unicept becomes equivocal between H2O and XYZ); unicepts can be empty (consider a child's "Santa Claus"-unicept). Finally, concepts have the function of classifying, while same-tracking is the essential function of unitrackers/unicepts.

In Chapter 4 Millikan notes that not all same-tracking mechanisms are unitrackers providing information for unicepts -- when I successfully re-identify an object's color as yellow, this does not feed information into my unicept for yellow. Having examined other same-tracking mechanisms which are not unitrackers, Millikan then distinguishes and analyses various different kinds of unitrackers/unicepts.

How is the reference of a unitracker/unicept fixed? In Chapter 5, Millikan rejects causal and descriptivist theories and argues: "The referent of a unicept corresponds . . . to the proper function of its unitracker, to what its unitracker is designed to track" (72). Proper functions are "effects of devices that have . . . been retained . . . and that continue to be duplicated or reproduced because they are producing these effects." (6) Millikan describes various ways in which a unitracker/unicept's reference is fixed. For instance, a duckling's imprinting mechanism has the "relational" function of creating a unitracker for the duckling's mother. So, if the duckling's mother is Samantha, the imprinting mechanism has an "adapted" function to create a unitracker for Samantha.

Chapter 7 examines various applications of Millikan's view: philosophical analysis, the reference of names, theory change in science, the observation-theory relation and the "Theory of Mind" problem.

Chapter 8 is an introduction to Part Two, which analyses how cognition interprets signs that carry natural information. Natural information is information carried by natural signs (black clouds can carry the information that it will rain) but also by intentional signs like linguistic signs. Signs carrying natural information are called "informational signs" ("infosigns"). An infosign is a state of affairs that is non-accidentally correlated with another state of affairs according to a "projection rule" (110). Infosigns that instantiate the same "vehicle type" or "surface form" can signify different states of affairs -- black clouds are sometimes followed not by rain but by snow, "in which case they are infosigns of snow." (110) So a sign vehicle type is not an infosign -- infosigns are particulars.

Chapter 9 offers an analysis of indexicals and demonstratives. Here Millikan defends the radical claim that these expressions can be used in "selfsigns", in which a sign component is also part of the signified and thus stands for itself. In "Would you please go!" the utterance is part of a larger sign which is partly constituted by the addressee and which signifies that the addressee should go. Millikan's argument for this thesis is that whatever must be observed to grasp a conventional sign's truth conditions is part of the sign (120) -- in the example, one must identify the addressee to grasp the utterance's satisfaction conditions.

Selfsigns are among the different kinds of infosigns analyzed in Chapter 10. Millikan examines various types of infosigns while also highlighting some important common features. She notes that infosigns "are signs of complete states of affairs. Neither the type 'dog' nor any token of 'dog' is an infosign" (125). So an infosign is articulated into components, and by substituting some components we obtain a different infosign: black clouds appearing at location l signify rain at l, while black clouds appearing at l* signify rain at l*. The "strength" of an infosign in a context measures how likely it is that, within that context, an infosign with that surface form signifies a certain state of affairs -- a bark coming from a house reliably indicates a dog, but coming from the plains of New Mexico, it reliably indicates a coyote.

Chapter 11 tackles the question: "What makes an infosign be a sign carrying natural information?" (138) Millikan argues against various existing views and develops a completely different hypothesis: "A sign . . . is the sort of thing that can serve as a sign." (144) An individual can only interpret infosigns in virtue of regularities in its environment. An infosign will then carry natural information only relative to an animal that can interpret it (148). In this sense, the notions of infosign and natural information are both relativized to individuals or species.

Chapter 12 discusses intentional signs. A central feature of such signs is that they can be "false or unsatisfied" (155). An intentional sign belongs to a "reproductively established family" (REF): a "family all of whose members are either directly or indirectly reproduced on the model of earlier members." (224) When the correlation between signs in the family and their signifieds repeats because the correlation serves both senders and receivers of the signs, the members of the family are intentional signs. Rabbits' danger thumps serve their receivers but also their senders -- at least by means of kin selection -- and this is the reason why the correlation between the thumps and their signified (danger) persists. Inner representations are also intentional signs, the initial producers being the animal's perceptual systems and the final consumers being its motor systems.

In Chapter 13 Millikan applies her theory to linguistic signs. She disagrees with traditional approaches on two fundamental points: first, reference determination for ambiguous terms, names and indexicals is a semantic process -- "'what is said' is fully given by the semantics of a language" (172); second, what determines the reference of such expressions is what REFs they were copied from, not speaker intentions. Chapter 16 extends this "anti-intentionalist" approach to incomplete descriptions, unrestricted quantifiers and possessives.

Chapter 14 argues that perception is also a process of sign interpretation, a process which is fallible even in its early stages. Then Millikan applies this model to defend the radical thesis that understanding language "is a form of perceptual processing" (185) -- one might just "hear that it is raining via someone's saying 'It's raining.'" (184) (I will say something about Chapter 15 below.)

As we have seen, one of Millikan's central theses is that, while concepts are supposed to be shared, unicepts are not. Millikan's main argument for the unshareability of unicepts goes as follows:

One's unicept for an individual or property or a kind is fed by a unitracker that may be totally idiosyncratic, and its activation triggers dispositions to call up other unicepts or associated affordances that are also idiosyncratic. (47)

Focusing on the first part of the quote, let us grant that different subjects have different ways of identifying the same object. The claim that the corresponding unicepts are not shared follows only if we assume:

(U) If unicepts U1 and U2 are associated with different ways of identifying an object, then U1 is different from U2

But (U) is both problematic in itself and in tension with Millikan's view. Chapter 15 describes various ways to represent identity. One possibility is duplication: the cognitive system can use token internal representations with the same "surface form", like different tokens of "Betty" in public language. But the system can also use the identity of an individual token to represent object identity (see Strawson 1974) -- in "Betty is tall and slender", the identity of the "Betty"-token indicates that the two properties are ascribed to the same person.

This second way of marking identity is essential, as Millikan recognizes (fn. 4 p. 49). Going back to an earlier example, suppose that at t1 I see a lion out of its cage. Immediately after, at t2, I hear the lion's angry roar. I now believe: "That lion is angry and out of its cage" (see Campbell 1987). Did I form two different beliefs at t1 and t2 and then infer their conjunction? For this inference to be rational, I would need to explicitly represent the identity of the lion I saw and the lion I heard, i.e. I would need to think: "The lion seen at t1 = the lion heard at t2". But it seems I did not think any such thought -- when tracking an object across time I do not keep track of the times of each perception. Even if I did I could certainly get confused, mistakenly thinking that I heard the lion at some time other than t2.

More plausibly, at t1, I formed a lion-unicept and connected it with the property out of its cage, then adding the connection angry to the same unicept at t2. But at t2, I recognized the lion using a different sense modality (hearing) than at t1, so I identified the object in two different ways at t1 and t2. Therefore, (U) is false at least as applied to tracking across time -- a unicept can remain the same even if different ways of identifying its referent feed information into it. We can then make a parallel hypothesis for the interpersonal case: the same unicept could be based on different methods of same-tracking in different individuals. A central component of Millikan's argument against concepts would then be undercut.


This research was partly funded by the Wissenschaftsfonds FWF (Fonds zur Förderung der wissenschaftlichen Forschung) within the project The Fragmented Mind: Belief, Rationality and Agency (P 27587-G15).


Campbell, J. (1987), "Is Sense Transparent?", Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 88, 273-92.

Strawson, P. F. (1974), Subject and Predicate in Logic and Grammar, Methuen.