Beyond Consequentialism

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Paul Hurley, Beyond Consequentialism, Oxford University Press, 2010, 275pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199698431.

Reviewed by Rahul Kumar, Queen's University


As T. M. Scanlon observed in his classic 1982 article, "Contractualism and Utilitarianism", within moral philosophy, consequentialism "represents a position one must struggle against if one wishes to avoid it". Thirty years later, the observation remains apposite. Though few amongst those who hold any kind of systematic view of moral reasoning find act consequentialism particularly compelling, many find plausible the view that some form of sophisticated consequentialism is likely to satisfy most of the desiderata for a plausible account of moral reasoning.

Paul Hurley's Beyond Consequentialism offers an insightful and impressively argued case for why the most plausible account of moral reasoning is unlikely to be some form of consequentialism. Those who already accept that the best view is likely to be some form of consequentialism are unlikely to be persuaded by his arguments. But those who remain uncommitted, or are drawn to some form of non-consequentialism but still feel the force of consequentialist thinking, will find Hurley persuasive.  He offers a compelling presentation of some of the most important challenges to the prospects of any form of consequentialism being able to do justice to certain deep features of commonsense moral thinking.  He also offers reasons to think that to do justice to these features we need a kind of view with a very different structure than any kind of consequentialism.

The first main strand in Hurley's case against consequentialism rests on the observation that it -- in particular, standard act consequentialism -- "jettisons ordinary morality but leaves ordinary reason in place" (183). It jettisons ordinary morality insofar as consequentialist moral standards make intuitively excessive demands concerning what individuals are required to do, and often reject features of ordinary moral thought such as deontic constraints as lacking a rational basis. That such standards are demanding is only unsettling, however, if we take for granted as sound an understanding of moral reasons as being authoritative, in at least the sense that they have a presumptive priority to other practical reasons in a person's deliberations. Traditional Hobbesian and Kantian accounts of moral reasoning offer accounts of the relationship between moral standards and what, on the basis of such standards, one has most moral reason to do, and what, as a matter of practical rationality, one has decisive reason to do, in order to show the intuitive priority of moral reasons to be secure. Consequentialist accounts of moral reasoning, though they often assume moral reasons to be authoritative, offer an account of moral standards but do not speak to the question of why we should think that consequentialist moral standards play a role in structuring an agent's practical deliberations in a way that vindicates the intuitive authoritativeness of moral reasons. Consequentialist moral standards, therefore, may make quite onerous demands of individuals in the name of morality, but it isn't clear that they are ones a properly deliberating agent has reason to comply with. As consequentialists are prepared to be revisionist about various intuitive features of commonsense morality, it will not do to simply assume that moral reasons are authoritative because it is intuitively plausible that they are.

Hurley brings the depth of the problem here into sharp relief through a reading of Bernard Williams's famous discussion of utilitarianism as an attack on an agent's integrity. Key to Williams's argument, as Hurley reads him, is an understanding of the rational agent as one whose practical reasons flow, through a sound deliberative route, from her attitudes, projects, and commitments. So understood, an agent's understanding of her reasons to do and care about various things is irreducibly first-personal: that she has reason to act in certain ways or care about certain things is inextricably tied to her judgment that the projects and commitments that matter to her are worth caring about in the way she does.

Consequentialist moral standards allow for the ranking of available courses of action with respect to the extent to which the result will be one of individual projects being pursued and commitments honored. The best available course of action is one that results in the maximization of the pursuit of projects and the honoring of commitments. The rankings established with reference to such standards only count as reasons for an agent to pursue certain courses of action, however, if she has as one of her projects the bringing about of the best available outcomes, as assessed from an impersonal point of view. Such a project would be a 'higher-order' project to the extent that "higher-order projects comprehend lower-order projects as their object, but they do not for this reason provide more comprehensive or authentic reasons" (82).

Whether or not the fact that a certain course of action is one that consequentialist moral standards identify as morally wrong counts as a decisive reason for an agent not to pursue it, then, turns on the depth and centrality to an agent's subjective motivational set of her other 'lower-order' projects and commitments. From her point of view, moral wrongness can only provide one reason amongst others, as it is a reason that flows from just one of the many projects and commitments that structure her deliberative outlook (74). Consequentialism, it turns out, does threaten to alienate the integrated rational agent. But the threat is not that of being alienated by morality's demands from the projects and commitments that make one's life irreducibly one's own, but of being alienated from morality's demands.

There is no rationale internal to consequentialism, on Hurley's view, for taking consequentialist moral standards to be authoritative in determining what one has decisive reason to do. But they present themselves as authoritative. A rational agent, committed to consequentialist moral standards in virtue of her higher order project of bringing about the best outcomes, is meant not only to take this project as a source of reasons, but as a source of decisive reasons. The threat to her standing as a rationally integrated agent arises from her seeing herself from two distinct standpoints. The first is that of herself as a rational agent who has various projects and commitments -- only one of which is the moral project -- any of which could, depending on the circumstances, be a source of decisive reasons to do one thing rather than another. The other involves her seeing herself as a moral agent whose commitment to impartiality requires that she adopt an impersonal stance towards her projects, seeing them as just someone's projects, and for whom moral reasons are always decisive in determining what there is reason to do. "The reasons that consequentialists presuppose an agent has to follow through with her lower-order projects and commitments" thus "lose their standing as reasons from the standpoint of the agent as utilitarian" (79). There is, then, not only no rationale for taking consequentialist moral standards to be authoritative, but their self-presentation as authoritative threatens to undermine the rational integrity of the agent who takes such standards to be the standards that ought to guide her in acting morally rightly.

The second main strand of Hurley's argument, one that highlights the route to getting beyond consequentialism, challenges the idea of impersonal consequentialism as a plausible articulation of a comprehensive moral standpoint from which actions can be evaluated as right or wrong. Consequentialism's characterization of the impartial moral standpoint as an impersonal standpoint is not wholly misguided. But it is better understood as limited to a standpoint from which some, but not all, important moral reasons can be helpfully articulated.

The argument builds on an observation of Williams's, that consequentialists recognize, as amongst the values whose promotion or maximization is constitutive of the best state of affairs, certain distinctly impartial, but not impersonal, moral values, like respect for rights, "autonomy, justice, fairness, loyalty, solidarity/friendship, and/or respect for persons as ends in themselves" (140). They are impartial, but not impersonal, moral values in two respects. First, they are values that are appealed to in justifying why it would be morally wrong to do what is likely to result in the best available state of affairs obtaining. Second, the particular rationales for their standing as moral values that ought to shape an individual's moral deliberations cannot be articulated in consequentialist terms.

The problem for consequentialism is that in plausibly recognizing the legitimacy of moral values that are impartial, but whose legitimacy does not rest on the availability of a plausible impersonal rationale for their significance, it ends up undermining any claim to the determination of what one has decisive impartial moral reason to do being exhausted by facts about what will result in better or worse states of affairs obtaining. Consequentialism may well capture an aspect of the impartial moral point of view, but it cannot defensibly be claimed to be a complete characterization of the moral standpoint, that which an agent takes up in determining what she has decisive moral reason to do.

If the impartial standpoint of morality is not best characterized in term of an impersonal ranking of possible states of affairs that can be brought about through one's actions, how ought it to be characterized? Hurley's answer to this question starts with a novel reinterpretation of Samuel Scheffler's well-known defense of the view that though commonsense permissions not to do what will result in the best state of affairs are sometimes justifiable, constraints on doing what will make things go best are not.

Scheffler's argument rests on the recognition of the natural independence of the agent's own point of view -- and the reasons that flow from the plans, projects, and commitments that structure it -- from the impersonal point of view. The moral importance of an agent not being alienated from these reasons justifies permitting the agent to give, as assessed from an impersonal point of view, a disproportionate weight to her own interests, liberating her from the requirement that she always do what is likely to result in the impersonally best outcome obtaining.

Hurley's reinterpretation of this argument goes beyond Scheffler, showing it to be more powerful than previously recognized. Two respects in which this is so are crucial for the overall argument of the book. First, if an agent is not to be alienated from the non-impersonal reasons that structure her personal point of view, it isn't enough, as Scheffler holds, that she be permitted to sometimes do other than the impersonally best thing. It also requires that others be constrained from alienating her from these reasons in the name of doing what is impersonally best;

Without this latter component you are always morally permitted (and sometimes required) to kill me for my inheritance or forcibly remove my organs for transplant, and in general to prevent me from acting for good reasons, whenever such an action on your part will bring about the best state of affairs (159).

Proper recognition of the independent moral significance of the agent's point of view requires both deontic permissions and deontic constraints.

Second, Scheffler's way of framing the justification of agent-centered permissions can be read as holding that the justification for such permissions is not impartial. Hurley's argument, as I understand it, is that this conclusion only follows if one accepts that moral impartiality has to do with ranking the impersonal value of possible outcomes. But it is a deep and unnoticed lesson of Scheffler's argument for agent-centered permissions that we ought not to accept this premise. His argument presupposes

a standpoint for the moral evaluation of actions from which partial and impersonal claims are appropriately weighed against each other. It is neither the partial nor the impersonal standpoint, but the standpoint from which a person appropriately takes impersonal moral reasons and the independent moral significance of non-impersonal reasons into account to the appropriate extent in which the determination of what it is right or wrong for them to do (169).

This standpoint is an impartial standpoint, but it is an interpersonal rather than impersonal standpoint, one grounded in the "recognition of the equal moral significance that each person has independent of whatever moral significance she has from the impersonal standpoint" (169) and appropriate, not to questions concerning the ranking of outcomes as better or worse, but to whether a potential course of action is morally right or wrong.

The move from an impersonal conception of impartiality, one that holds the comparative assessment of possible states of affairs to be load-bearing, to an interpersonal conception, built on the recognition of the independent moral significance of one another's personal points, takes us, according to Hurley, beyond consequentialism. This is particularly so with respect to the question of how to account for the rational authority of moral standards. The impersonal conception of impartiality presupposed by consequentialism (particularly act consequentialism) is one that is in tension with the legitimacy of certain familiar commonsense permissions and constraints. This debars consequentialists from simply taking as intuitively given the rational authority of the moral standards they take to be impartially justified, as what are intuitively authoritative are commonsense moral standards that recognize certain permissions and constraints with respect to doing what is impersonally best.

An interpersonal conception of impartiality, on the other hand, lends itself to the recognition of the legitimacy of various commonsense agent-relative permissions to act and agent-relative constraints not to be interfered with. The rational authority of moral standards that appeal to this conception of impartiality do not, therefore, call out for defense, as they do not invite a skeptical attitude towards their rational authority (218). Quite the opposite: moral standards that underwrite various permissions and constraints are so tightly interwoven with familiar interpersonal reactive attitudes like resentment, guilt, and indignation that, though there are good questions to be asked about the basis of their authority, it is difficult to entertain the idea that their being authoritative might be an illusion (187).

Hurley's case for moving to an interpersonal understanding of impartiality is one that I find both congenial and compelling. Points about which I remain unconvinced lie at the level of particular details concerning the way he understands the interpersonal standpoint, not the general picture. Here I will just mention one, concerning the relationship between the interpersonal standpoint, as Hurley characterizes it, and the rational authority of morality. First, whether an interpersonal understanding of impartiality will succeed in taking us beyond consequentialism seems to me to depend not just on whether the interpersonal conception of impartiality will allow us to make better sense of the rational authority of moral standards. We also need to know whether the interpersonal view has the resources to allow us to make good sense of those aspects of commonsense morality, such as the requirement that, ceteris paribus, one benefit the greater number, that, at least initially, appear to be made best sense of by appeal to considerations having to do with better or worse impersonally evaluated states of affairs, of the kind to which consequentialism draws our attention.

Hurley is alive to this point, arguing that, in some cases, the interpersonal view can recognize that some interpersonal claims are best articulated "from the impersonal standpoint, facts about better and worse states of affairs that count in favor of or against proposed courses of action" (221). My worry is that this kind of move lets the cat out of the bag. Once we recognize that considerations articulated from the impersonal standpoint can justify certain courses of action, what principled basis do we have for sequestering the relevance of such considerations to particular contexts, but not others?

We may want to defend the commonsense view that we can't kill the healthy person in order to harvest his organs in an effort to save even a great many people. But if the individual's claim not to be interfered with is to be justified by certain agent-relative reasons for not wanting to be interfered with that need to be weighed against certain agent-neutral considerations that draw our attention to the extent things would go better were those many ill individuals to be benefited, it is far from clear that the individual's intuitive claim not to have his organs harvested is nearly as strong as we think it is. It won't, I think, do to simply hold that claims not to be interfered with are not defeasible in the face of compelling agent-neutral considerations. Intuitively, many will find that to be an implausible position. But more importantly, what is needed is a principled answer as to why agent-neutral considerations don't simply end up swamping agent-relative reasons for not wanting to be interfered with. Consequentialism offers us principled grounds for thinking that they are swamped in this way. It's an unintuitive position, but resisting it requires the resistance of a good theoretical justification, not simply an appeal to it being intuitive.

To generalize this worry: the strength of the interpersonal standpoint is meant, in part, to lie in it not being in tension with the rational authority of morality because it recognizes the justificatory force of good non-impersonal reasons that agents have for acting and for not being treated in certain ways. But to secure the congruence of the interpersonal standpoint with the rational authority of morality, it needs to be shown that these reasons do in fact justify, perhaps roughly, the contours of commonsense moral permissions and constraints. Hurley does not pretend to have made this case. My point is that, on the basis of the interpersonal standpoint as he understands it, this might be a much harder case to make than he suggests. It may be that developing plausible rationales for certain familiar permissions and constraints requires that we reject both impersonal reasons having any role to play from an interpersonal standpoint and those aspects of commonsense morality that appear to be best made sense of by appeal to impersonal reasons.

Concerns about the relationship between the interpersonal standpoint and the rational authority of morality can also be pressed with respect to the standing of agent-relative reasons. Hurley locates the failure of consequentialism in its not being able to recognize, in the right way, the force of agent-relative reasons to pursue projects, commitments, particular relationships, and to care about certain things. Why don't these reasons give us, in some cases, good grounds for disregarding the demands of impartial morality?

The approach to answering this question that Hurley briefly outlines is one that holds that the reasons that flow from such partial commitments "are not reasons from a fundamentally non-impartial foundation; they are good agent-relative reasons to act precisely in virtue of being normalized through the agent's deliberative field into the interpersonally structured space of reasons" (224). All good practical reasons, that is, are in fact impartial reasons to act (ibid.).

My worry is not with whether or not this strategy can be made to work, but with whether it is independently plausible that doing justice to the rational authority of morality requires ruling out the possibility that there can be good reasons for an individual to decide, in certain cases, that conformity to morality matters less than something else he cares deeply about. Hurley appears to accept the Kantian view that it is. But that is a far from uncontroversial position. Some explanation, I think, is required to make clear what of intuitive importance about the rational authority of morality is lost if we don't hold partial reasons to be implicitly interpersonal, allowing that they can sometimes compete with, and even defeat, impartial moral reasons in the determination of what an agent has decisive reason to do.

Beyond Consequentialism is a model of rigorous and creative argument. Though the idea that we need to look to an interpersonal conception of impartiality to find an intuitively plausible alternative to consequentialism has been in the air for a while now, Hurley has done an exemplary job of making clear, in a way it had not previously been, the considerable promise of developing an interpersonal understanding of impartiality as what is needed if the lingering appeal of consequentialism is to be exorcised once and for all.