Beyond Good and Evil

Placeholder book cover

Nietzsche, Friedrich, Beyond Good and Evil, Rolf-Peter Horstmann and Judith Norman (eds.), translated by Judith Norman, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 193pp, $14.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521770785.

Reviewed by Maudemarie Clark, Colgate University


Introductions to earlier English translations of Beyond Good and Evil (BGE) hail it as “one of the great books of the nineteenth-century, indeed of any century,” and as “one of the greatest books of a very great thinker.” Rolf-Peter Horstmann’s introduction to this new translation is decidedly less enthusiastic. He presents it as “a perplexing fact” that it is “so difficult” to decide whether the book is great or “utterly irrational,” containing only “silly proclamations based on unwarranted generalization,” and seems to find it easier to support the latter view. In fact, his account of how BGE might plausibly be considered a great book is fairly unconvincing. After explaining why, I will suggest an alternative view of the book’s greatness, one that forms the basis for my judgment of Judith Norman’s new translation, which I believe improves upon Walter Kaufmann’s standard English translation in certain respects, but backtracks from it in others.

BGE’s apparent faults concern both content and style. Its “distinctive positive doctrines,” such as that of the will to power, are difficult to find plausible, and its “stylistic peculiarities” as a work of philosophy are that it seems unconcerned with either the objectivity of its views or the structure of their presentation. It appears to be an arbitrarily arranged collection of the author’s most passionately held opinions, without argument or grounds to support them. Because its remarks are given the form of numbered sections and organized into nine parts, each with its own title, Kaufmann warned us long ago not to read them as a mere “collection of aphorisms for browsing.” With one exception, each part was to be read “straight-through,” for each “pursues one set of problems” and ideas are frequently qualified in later sections and may undergo surprising developments. In the absence of details substantiating this view, however, it has been difficult to avoid reading BGE as a mere collection. Laurence Lampert’s recent commentary on the book finally gives us a strong case for supposing that each of the parts, again with one exception, unfolds as a coherent but latent argument, and that it also contributes to an overall argument concerning the task and future of philosophy. Horstmann, who would not have had access to Lampert’s book, tries a different approach, attempting to solve the problem of BGE’s style by taking it to be dictated by Nietzsche’s perspectivism.

The strategy has been tried previously, in particular by Nehamas, but Horstmann bases his version of it on what he presents as a new interpretation of perspectivism, one that avoids the problems that afflict its traditional version. According to his “socio-historical” and “more commonsensical understanding” of the doctrine, perspectivism claims not that no view is true or supported by objective reasons, but only that “every truth is a partial truth or a perspectival fiction.” I am not entirely sure that I understand the difference. The beginning of Horstmann’s argument for the perspectivism he attributes to Nietzsche is solid enough: to understand a claim, hence to be in a position to judge its truth, one must understand the context from which it is made. But matters become more problematic when he interprets the context of an utterance as the “personal attitudes, subjective experiences, and private evaluations which form the basis of the view expressed,” and argues that since “we are never in a position to be familiar with a context in its entirety … every truth is defined by [a] necessarily incomplete context” and is therefore only a partial truth. Putting the conclusion in terms of truth seems confusing at best. Even if we are never fully in a position to judge the truth of a statement, it does not follow that the statement (or the statement we take it to be) is not (fully) true. Horstmann would be better off if he gave up on the idea of making sense of a partial or perspectival truth and confined perspectivism to a claim about our knowledge of truth. Perhaps that is what he intends. In any case, that seems to fit better his basic point about how perspectivism makes sense of BGE’s stylistic features, its subjectivity and randomness. These features serve “a methodological function,” he claims, insofar as perspectivism “makes it incumbent on an author to convey as much information about [his] context as possible,” and BGE does precisely this by “presenting a whole array of thoughts which are designed primarily to inform us about the various subjective stances of the individual making [its] claims.” To make sense of BGE in these terms, Horstmann doesn’t need a problematic notion of perspectival truth. But he does need much more support than he offers for thinking that having more information about Nietzsche’s “subjective stances”—his “personal attitudes, subjective experiences, and private evaluations”—puts us in a better position to understand and judge the truth of his claims. It seems implausible that such information really puts us in a better position to determine the content or judge the truth of his claim that life is will to power or that “new philosophers” who create values are needed to save Western culture from complete degeneration. In fact, when Horstmann turns his attention to such distinctive doctrines of BGE, he does not try to present them as partial truths or to understand them in terms of Nietzsche’s “subjective stances.” He tries to make them plausible in terms of objective factors, and when this fails, he criticizes them, advising us that if we wish to understand the appeal of BGE, it is best “not to look too closely at [its] actual teachings.” They fascinate us not because they are plausible, much less correct, but “precisely because of their pointed one-sidedness, their extravagance, and their eccentricity.” Nor does BGE hold our interest because we share its preoccupations, for many of its themes are now “rather obsolete” and we lack “immediate access [to others] because they are deeply rooted in their nineteenth-century contexts.” Horstmann’s treatment of BGE’s content thus fails to support his attempt to make sense of the book’s style in terms of perspectivism or to offer any insight into why one might admire it.

In the end, Horstmann explains the attraction of BGE in terms of its ability to act as a “sort of mental tonic.” By questioning the truth and objectivity of beliefs constitutive of a “normal way of life,” it encourages us to confront our own doubts and suspicions about the foundations of our beliefs and may thereby make us “feel less worried about our inability to account for some of our central convictions in an ‘absolute’ way.” Here perspectivism is evidently reduced to a rejection of foundationalism, and BGE’s greatness to its helpfulness for overcoming the uneasiness induced by that rejection. But easing our discomfort was never Nietzsche’s aim, and doing so would not speak very strongly in favor of his book’s greatness. To see BGE as a masterpiece, we need a different view of it than the one Horstmann provides, one more in line with Lampert’s view that its manifest content differs from its latent arguments.

Consider the preface to Daybreak, which Nietzsche wrote shortly after finishing BGE. Here he claims to say quietly and “more coldly” what he usually says “loudly and with such fervor” (namely, “what we are and what we want”) by calling himself “a philologist still, that is to say, a teacher of slow reading.” He characterizes philology as “a goldsmith’s art and connoisseurship of the word” - an art that “teaches to read well, that is to say, to read slowly, deeply, looking cautiously before and aft, with reservations, with doors left open, with delicate eyes and fingers.” Ending with the injunction “learn to read me well,” this passage suggests that the goal to which Nietzsche’s writing and philosophizing is directed is that of teaching to read well. This may seem a rather modest goal for a thinker who regarded himself as “dynamite” and a “destiny,” unless we remember his warning that reading is dying in the modern world and that “the great, the incomparable art of reading well” is the “presupposition for the tradition of culture” (Antichrist 59). What is at stake in teaching to read well is the very future of intellectual culture and culturedness.

Can we possibly see BGE, permeated as it appears to be by subjectivity and randomness, as teaching the art of reading slowly and deeply? We can if we see these as surface features that veil a deeper structure and concern with objectivity or argument. After all, to teach the art of reading, Nietzsche must write so as to reward the kind of reading he wishes to elicit. When one reads “slowly, deeply,” there must be insights to be gained. When one looks “cautiously before and aft,” there must be something to see, connections to be drawn. When one reads “with reservations, with doors left open, with delicate fingers and eyes,” there must be subtleties and deeper levels of understanding to be achieved. An arbitrarily arranged collection of aphorisms would clearly not be up to the task, whereas a book that slowly reveals its structure and internal connections as one learns to read it better would be ideal. And this, I think, is what BGE offers, and why Nietzsche’s own description of it in Ecce Homo puts stress on the subtlety or refinement of its form. Horstmann is right to stress the lack of form or structure on the surface, and the fact that many readers are drawn in to the book by its passion, certainty, and apparent contempt for anything conventional, including the discipline of thinking. But he misses the deeper level of thought that begins to open up as one learns to read it well. He denies in effect that there is any such deeper level when he argues at length that we should not be looking for arguments in BGE. Nietzsche is interested in unearthing and exploring exciting and unorthodox possibilities, not in “objectively valid judgments” or in “being in possession of a ‘good argument’.” Admittedly, Nietzsche does not offer arguments on a platter or club us over the head with them. With few (and interesting) exceptions, he does not present arguments in argumentative or premise/conclusion form. But he gives arguments, which is to say that he makes claims and gives reasons that support them. It is just that it usually takes a lot of thought to figure out what the claims and reasons are; he invites or seduces us to figure that out for ourselves. The various techniques by which he induces such thinking, often by veiling his argument or distracting our attention from its conclusion or structure, are part and parcel of how he teaches the art of reading to those willing to learn from him.

To clinch his case that Nietzsche is not interested in argument, Horstmann cites BGE 213, which he interprets as claiming that “the ‘right’ way of doing philosophy” is to think “at a presto.” He takes Nietzsche’s reference to those who “imagine every necessity as a need, a painful having to follow and being compelled “ as characterizing “normal philosophers” and “the procedure of establishing results via sound argument.” But this distorts the main point of the passage, which is that the experience of most thinkers and scholars does not give them a sense for “the genuinely philosophical compatibility between a bold and lively spirituality that runs along at a presto and a dialectical rigor and necessity that does not take a single false step.” This reference to “dialectical rigor,” which Horstmann ignores, makes little sense if Nietzsche is uninterested in argument. Those who Nietzsche claims experience dialectical necessity as a “painful having to follow and being compelled” are those who fail to recognize the boldness and liveliness of Nietzsche’s prose as compatible with the strictest argumentative rigor. BGE’s exemplification of this compatibility and the mastery of everything that makes this possible are what lead me to consider it a masterpiece. It exploits the excitement that comes from the experience of throwing off discipline to draw readers into thinking in the most disciplined way about the highest and most serious things, and to make such thinking utterly alive and exciting. This is a great achievement. But recognizing it in BGE requires learning to read it well.

Translating a text should be an excellent way to learn to read it, and the translator can facilitate or hinder a reader’s ability to do the same. This is the main viewpoint from which I approach Judith Norman’s new translation. Like the earlier translations by Kaufmann, Hollingdale, and Farber, hers meets high standards for accuracy, avoiding outright misreadings, and successfully conveys much of Nietzsche’s tone and various aspects of his style. And she frequently overcomes the stiffness of other translations with a more idiomatic and lively expression. A small example: “watch out for” rather than “let us beware of” as translation of Vorsicht vor in BGE 13. But does Norman’s translation make any special contribution to reading the text well? Her translation of the poem at the end seems to me a major contribution. It is a difficult poem to appreciate. Its meaning seems all too obvious—Nietzsche has been abandoned by friends because his philosophy, hence self, has undergone change, and he waits longingly for new ones who can keep up with him precisely because they themselves change—and it has none of the verve, playfulness, humor, parody or self-parody of Nietzsche’s best poetry. Norman does a much better job than Kaufmann did (Hollingdale did not even try) of preserving the poem’s most striking feature, its very strict rhyme and rhythm scheme. Her translation thereby allows readers the possibility of seeing the poem’s manifestly strict form, open content and direct expression of Nietzsche’s feelings as a foil for the veiled form (the manifest formlessness), content, and feeling of the prose parts of the book.

She also seems to display more consistency in using the same English word to translate the same philosophically relevant German word than we find in Kaufmann. This is especially important in Nietzsche’s case because of his mastery of the language he uses. His choice of words often sets up echos across the text, suggesting unobvious possibilities for interpretation to those who can hear them. A translator can make these inaudible. So, for instance, Kaufmann renders the German word Trieb as both “drive” and “instinct” and then also uses the latter to translate Instinkt. This is no small matter when the project of Part 1 of BGE is to present “social structure of drives and affects” as an alternative to reigning philosophical accounts of the human soul and it also introduces the will to power as the “cardinal drive of an organic being.” If one substitutes “instinct” for “drive” in the last quoted phrase, as Kaufmann does, one effectively prevents readers from considering the possibility that the will to power is being presented as the principle not of life in the biological sense, but of the human soul. Kaufmann probably assumed that if the will to power belongs to everything organic, it is less like the drives that constitute the soul than like an instinct, but by substituting his judgment for Nietzsche’s (who could have used Instinkt instead of the same word he had just used to describe the soul in a nearby passages), he costs readers the possibility of noticing that Nietzsche could be using “organic” in the sense of “systematic interconnectedness,” which might serve as his criterion for strength of soul, instead of in the biological sense. Alone among the translators, Norman translates Trieb consistently as “drive,” and so does not deprive readers of this possibility. I am afraid, however, that she undoes this advantage in her attempt to make Nietzsche sound less odd or stilted than he sometimes does in other translations. Nietzsche’s play with the terms “drive” and “organic” climaxes in BGE 36, which urges us to risk the hypothesis that the mechanical or mechanistic world is a “pre-form of life,” (in my literal translation) “a kind of drive-life in which all the organic functions are still synthetically intertwined with self-regulation, assimilation, nourishment, excretion and metabolism.” But these functions are organic functions; how can they be intertwined with the organic functions? This oddity in Nietzsche’s text should prompt readers to wonder how he is using the term “organic” here and send them back to his use of the term and his characterization of “life” in earlier sections for help. Kaufmann erases almost all of what would lead to this kind of reflection, however, first by rendering Triebleben as “instinctive life,” and then by translating the simple mit as “along with.” He thereby makes it possible to read the line so that Nietzsche is including self-regulation and the other functions mentioned among the organic functions instead of having them unite with the organic functions. (Hollingdale creates the same effect by adding “together” to “with.”) Norman goes even further, as did Marion Farber in 1998: both omit “with” entirely and place Nietzsche’s list of functions in parentheses, so that they are now being identified as the organic functions. This wipes out all trace of the oddity in the German, and with it any chance for the kind of reflection that Nietzsche’s use of “organic” and “drive” in this passage should induce. Norman thus undermines the effect that her consistent use of “drive” for Trieb might otherwise have had.

The attempt to make Nietzsche sound better in English than he does in a more literal translation also makes Norman’s translation of BGE’s anti-feminist tirade less helpful to a careful reader than Kaufmann’s. In the last ten sections of Part 7, Nietzsche evidently wages war against enlightenment about the traditional position of women or liberation from it. Women engaged in such a project are not capable of seeking truth and betray a “corruption of instincts” and so much pedantry, superficiality, and arrogance that they are best off if “restrained and kept under control by their fear of men.” A man of any profundity and benevolence will in fact think of women “in an oriental manner,” as “a possession, as property that can be locked up, as predestined for servitude and fulfilled by that.” No wonder Horstmann advises us “never to forget” that Nietzsche “speaks to us from the past,” that his concerns are often “obsolete” and inaccessible to us! But this really sells Nietzsche short. There is just too much in these sections that should lead readers to be suspicious of the initial impression they make. One example concerns Nietzsche’s professed topic in this section—not women, but das Weib an sich, which Kaufmann translates as “woman as such.” Unfortunately he thereby obliterates the obvious connection to the famous “ding an sich,” which Nietzsche criticizes earlier in BGE as a contradiction in terms. Further, Kaufmann confusingly translates das Weib, the object at which Nietzsche proceeds to direct his derogatory comments, sometimes as “woman” and sometimes as “women,” thereby making it more difficult for readers to consider the possibility that Nietzsche’s talk of “woman” is about the social construction of the female or feminine and not about individual women who may or may not exemplify it. Indeed, a major point of these section may be to point to the contradictions in our idea of the female—which, Nietzsche shows us here, includes being both more natural hence animal-like and more spiritual than the male—which make it impossible for any individual woman to exemplify it. Norman’s translation takes an encouraging opening step towards allowing readers to see this kind of possibility when she translates das Weib an sich as “woman an sich” because “any English rendering is clumsy and the German retains both the gender neutrality and the philosophical connotations of the term.” This perhaps gives up too easily on the possibility of translation (“the female in itself” would seem to be a solution, especially since it would leave “woman” free to translate the more respectful German term Frau, which Nietzsche uses here to refer to individual women), but at least it allows readers (by way of a footnote) the possibility of seeing the connection to Nietzsche’s criticism of the thing in itself as a contradiction in terms. Unfortunately, Norman undermines this advantage by proceeding to use the plural “women” almost exclusively to translate Nietzsche’s singular, das Weib, thereby leaving substantially less in the text than Kaufman does to help readers notice the possibility that Nietzsche is not talking about individual women but about the contradictory essence of the feminine that women are supposed to exemplify, or about individual women insofar as they attempt to exemplify it. And this is no small thing since noticing this possibility is the entry point for a number of other important points suggested in this part of BGE.

In conclusion, let me stress that Norman’s translation is generally reliable and has some advantages over existing versions of BGE. Having another good translation of this text should serve the valuable function of provoking more thought and discussion about the particular words Nietzsche uses and why he uses them. But it does not surpass existing translations or make the contribution to learning to read BGE that I was looking for or that my initial impressions of the translation led me to expect.