Beyond Humanity?

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Allen Buchanan, Beyond Humanity? Oxford University Press, 2011, 286pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199587810.

Reviewed by Fabrice Jotterand, The University of Texas Southwestern Medical Center, Dallas


In Beyond Humanity? Allen Buchanan urges that the debate on human enhancement go beyond the question of whether we should transform human nature. Rather, he contends that reflections, informed by evolutionary biology, need to focus on how we should ethically and responsively use enhancement biotechnologies. The book has eight chapters. Chapter 1, "The Landscape of the Enhancement Debate," provides an overview of the current debate. Chapter 2, "Enhancement and Human Development," addresses the question of whether it is morally permissible, "in a reasonably liberal and democratic society," to pursue enhancement. Chapter 3, "Character," assesses the claims made by some people that the quest for enhancement reflects some type of vice. Chapter 4, "Human Nature and the Natural", responds to the worry that enhancement is unnatural or against human nature. In chapter 5, "Conservatism and Enhancement," Buchanan focuses on the political debate surrounding human enhancement and provides a critique of conservative arguments against enhancement. The final three chapters look at more practical issues such as the question of unintended bad consequences ("Unintended Bad Consequences"), the issue of the moral status of enhanced individuals ("Moral Status and Enhancement") and the question of distributive justice and the access to innovation ("Distributive Justice and the Diffusion of Innovation").

Buchanan begins his analysis with a definition of biomedical enhancement that is noncommittal regarding whether people are better off following an enhancement procedure: "A biomedical enhancement is a deliberate intervention, applying biomedical science, which aims to improve an existing capacity that most or all normal human beings typically have, or to create a new capacity, by acting directly on the body or brain" (p. 23). Buchanan does not hold that enhancements necessarily improve the condition of an individual. Enhanced memory, for instance, might help for specific tasks but might also be problematic due to memory overload. In addition, his definition does not commit to the claim that enhancements are strictly biomedical. Cognitive enhancement can be achieved by other means (e.g., literacy).

Buchanan holds is that human enhancement is somewhat of a fait accompli. Mankind will continue to evolve and biotechnology will allow the creation of posthuman beings. Hence, he thinks the debate between proponents and opponents of human enhancement has become increasingly sterile because the wheel of the technological imperative will continue to spin and the attempt to stop technological progress is a vain pursuit. In his view, the low quality of these debates is due to five specific reasons: 1) the rhetoric and ill-founded argumentation characteristic of these debates; 2) the lack of due consideration of the fundamentals of evolutionary biology and its relevance to enhancement debates; 3) the methodological naiveté of debates about enhancement; 4) the failure to articulate clearly arguments for and against biomedical enhancement (mostly on the part of critics of enhancement); and 5) the idle state of the debate, which has addressed the same question for the last twenty years. For the above reasons, Buchanan suggests moving to the next stage, that is, engaging in discussion that addresses how "to figure out effective, realistic institutional responses to the challenges of enhancement" (p. xii) by raising the following question: "Is it ethically permissible for a reasonably liberal and democratic society to embark on the enhancement enterprise?" (p. 16)

I would like to make a few critical comments concerning Buchanan's approach. First, he assumes that most people in a liberal and democratic society are willing to embark on the train of enhancement. As stated earlier, he is not concerned with the question of whether we should develop enhancement biotechnologies but how we should implement them responsively. Granted, we cannot stop research and development of biomedical technologies. The prospect of applying the latest developments of biotechnology for the enhancement and advancement of the human species holds exciting promises that will benefit mankind in many areas, such as health, living conditions, etc. However, there is totalizing discourse in Buchanan's analysis that should raise concerns. We live in a global world in which the exchange of information and the impact of events that occur in one culture or region affect world economies and ecologies. What could happen to human beings, in terms of biomedical enhancement, does not affect exclusively people in a particular society (i.e., "a reasonably liberal and democratic society") but the whole human species. For this reason, whether we should pursue enhancement should still be at the forefront of our reflections, especially if we want to avoid the hijacking of biotechnologies for political or ideological agendas. It appears imprudent to think we can disregard the question.

An ongoing questioning provides a system of checks and balances that allow technology to advance responsibly, albeit at a slower pace. Expediency is never a promising strategy even in the light of sometimes long and sterile debates. Buchanan's reflection appears shortsighted with respect to the potential impact of the presence of enhanced individuals in other societies, beyond "reasonably liberal and democratic societies." For instance, the development of nuclear weapons by one country does not affect only one region of the world but global geopolitics. The recent nuclear disaster in Fukushima affected countries beyond the Pacific Rim. Countries like Switzerland and Germany, while not affected directly by the incident, have begun procedures to become independent from nuclear power as a result of the Fukushima disaster. We might wonder at the disruptive impact, if any, of human enhancement technologies on cultures and societies not as advanced technologically as ours.

The second set of critical comments I would like to offer about Buchanan's analysis concerns the failure to acknowledge and analyze the conflictual context in which these debates take place, beyond a political framework configured in terms of bioconservatives vs. anti-anti-enhancement or pro-enhancement people. There are two problems in Buchanan's approach. First, the avoidance of continued reflection on whether we should enhance human beings positions the debate in the political arena (democratic debate), where the modus operandi is based on the majority argument. The majority argument does not necessarily include a justification, on an ethical ground, for enhancement. It only expresses what the majority thinks ought to be done; it does not establish the reasons why a particular course of action and/or a specific procedure is ethically acceptable. To adjudicate disagreement concerning the implications of enhancement biotechnologies, moral discourse in the public square should take the form of a deliberative democratic process that recognizes the limitations of social collaboration. Deliberative democracy, however, does not necessarily rule out the possibility, through a political and discursive process, of reaching a managed agreement that will integrate moral arguments for the justification of the implementation of enhancement technologies.

In Chapter 8, Buchanan attempts to capture some elements of ethical justification. In order to avoid unscrutinized and unregulated enhancement through backdoor practices as spinoffs from treatments, he suggests a framework to address the question of "justice in the diffusion of innovations" (p. 245). Here Buchanan needs to develop a framework to justify his moral stance about enhancement and how his concept of justice produces moral content. Distributive justice has a broad range of understandings (i.e., egalitarian, libertarian, communitarian, utilitarian, etc.) that need a justification other than political (i.e., they need a moral justification). Without a proper dialectic between political justification and moral justification the debate over enhancement will continue to stagnate because no real constructive discourse takes place. The unwillingness to address more seriously the question of whether we should enhance human beings impoverishes and polarizes the debates because it fails to provide answers and clarifications that many seek.

While some readers may not agree with the enhancement agenda and its ethical and social implications, Buchanan does offer a thorough analysis of a complex issue. He has produced an important book worth reading independent of one's views about the topic. It is well argued, clearly written, and presents a comprehensive analysis of the relevant key questions in the debate. To my knowledge this volume is the most wide-ranging exploration on human enhancement, and I would recommend it to anyone wanting to get a good grasp of the current debate. Both camps, bioconservatives and anti-anti-enhancement/pro-enhancement people, will benefit from the arguments Buchanan advances.