Beyond Liberal Democracy: Political Thinking for an East Asian Context

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Daniel A. Bell, Beyond Liberal Democracy: Political Thinking for an East Asian Context, Princeton University Press, 2006, 379pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780691123080.

Reviewed by Justin Tiwald, San Francisco State University


In this collection of essays, Bell makes a compelling case for what he calls "morally legitimate alternatives to Western-style liberal democracy in the East Asian region" (8). Although the largest part of the book focuses on Chinese speaking countries such as China, Taiwan, and Singapore, Bell rightly characterizes the book as addressing issues that tend to apply to other East Asian societies and political cultures. Its concerns are wide-ranging, with essays devoted to topics as various as Confucian just war theory, the viability of democratic regimes in East Asia, and the advantages of characteristically Japanese, Korean, and Chinese forms of capitalism. Despite the eclectic nature of this collection, most of its essays are united by the shared goal of articulating reasons to temper some of the West's most treasured political ideals so as to suit the distinctiveness of East Asian cultures and political traditions.

With just a few exceptions, most of these essays are aimed at undermining what Bell sometimes calls "liberal fundamentalism" (339). This is the view that certain liberal values, such as the commitment to free speech rights or the principle of one-person one-vote, should be secured in all political societies regardless of economic or cultural circumstances. I call it a "disposition" rather than an "ideology" because (as Bell seems to admit) it is not a systematic position that many liberals explicitly endorse but an insidious tendency that they manifest on a case-by-case basis. Appropriately, then, Bell's book focuses on the particular cases in which liberal principles are regarded as either inviolable or, at best, rightly suspended only under extraordinary circumstances. In three sections, Bell addresses what he calls the "main pillars of liberal democracy": human rights, democratic government, and capitalism (323).

The first section of the book focuses on human rights. It begins with an explication of Confucian "just war theory," noting a "realist" strain of thought in Mencius that justifies war when it has some chance of success, and when it is waged either in defense of one's own people or for the sake of liberating others from a tyrant (so long as the oppressed peoples are likely to welcome their liberators). The second chapter of this section addresses a number of disputes about the appropriateness of ascribing "rights" to East Asian political traditions, and whether distinctively Asian rights should take priority over the sorts of human rights championed by Western countries and international institutions such as the U.N. This chapter shows Bell at his best, cutting through much of the impassioned rhetoric to show where the substantive normative issues lie, and noting that many apparent debates about rights are actually disputes about sociological and economic facts. Both at the conclusion of this chapter, as well as in the following chapter on the successes and blunders of international human rights NGOs, Bell makes a powerful case for leaving the prioritization of competing rights to community advocates and hands-on human rights workers rather than theorists or foreign governments.

Also in this section, Bell embraces the view that talk of "rights" is appropriate for Confucian political traditions, observing that imperial legal codes and the classical Confucian thinkers themselves recognized many entitlements and duties that "belong to human persons simpliciter, independent of their roles" (63). Like Bell and many others, such as Joseph Chan and Stephen Angle, I agree that there are well-established precedents in the Confucian tradition for modern rights talk. An important issue that Bell's analysis raises, though, is whether these rights (or proto-rights) were meant to have any bite. Even if Confucian societies have recognized role-independent entitlements that those in positions of power are supposed to observe, it does not follow from this that the subjects of that power were legitimately entitled to enforce them. That is, it is not clear that these rights came with an endorsement of popular remedies, such that people would be morally justified in engaging in civil disobedience or rebellion. Without this additional prerogative, the ruler's subjects are left in a predicament often attributed to the citizens of the Hobbesian state: morally entitled to baseline good treatment from their sovereign, but morally prohibited from enforcing it against the sovereign. In my view the Confucian classics are deeply ambivalent about such a prerogative. Mencius famously distinguishes between the killing of a "true king," which is forbidden, and the killing of a king who has lost his moral entitlement to rule (Mencius 1B8). But so much depends upon whether the people themselves are authorized to decide when a king has lost his entitlement to rule or whether such judgments are properly left to "Heaven" or some other authority. I find no clear answer to this in the classical Confucian tradition.

Bell devotes his second section to dispelling some (but not all) of the allure of establishing Western-style democratic regimes in East Asian contexts. He begins with a primarily historical essay on the relationship between public sponsorship of athletics in ancient Greece and China. He then offers two stimulating chapters that defend certain forms of government by elites over and against government by democratic representatives. The first of these elaborates upon his previous work on Confucian democracy, where he offered a novel way of blending representative democracy as found in the West and a Confucian conception of rule by a scholarly elite. Bell proposes a bicameral legislature with an upper house of scholar-officials chosen by civil service exams (often associated with the seventeenth century Confucian reformer Huang Zongxi) and a lower house of representatives chosen by popular vote. The lower house, Bell argues, will provide an important democratic check on flagrant abuses of power. The upper house will provide a check on the democratic propensity to pander to short-term interests and selective constituencies.

Bell's second essay on democracy defends elitism by arguing that in East Asia, less-than-democratic regimes have proven to be better than democratic regimes at protecting the interests of minorities. On this topic Bell continues his ongoing dispute with the liberal defender of minority rights Will Kymlicka, arguing on the strength of considerable evidence that Kymlicka's expectations of liberal democratic regimes are not borne out in East Asia. Bell then concludes with a chapter that defends his approach to multicultural education, building on an evocative personal account of his first experience in teaching a multicultural curriculum in Singapore.

Of all of the essays included in this collection, I have the strongest reservations about Bell's defense of elitism, even when construed more benignly as a blend of democratic rule and rule by scholar-officials. To make his case, Bell relies heavily on the assumption that the elites will sustain a stronger interest in the long-term good of the whole than would democratically elected representatives. This is, obviously, an assumption well worth debating. To Bell's credit, he offers several institutional regulations and procedures that could help to reinforce these benevolent tendencies. But even if we grant the controversial claim that they can be suitably reinforced, I am not certain that elite rule offers the better path to Bell's stated goals. Take, for example, the need to protect minorities from tyrannical majorities. Surely a better-tested approach would be to entrust this power to a robust and independent judiciary rather than to the discretion of a deliberative body, for insofar as the protection of minority rights is at the discretion of anyone, even a well-intentioned group of scholar-officials, the rights of minorities will be subject to debate and reconsideration. Minority rights are guarded more vigilantly by professionals who see it as a prescribed duty than by legislators who see such rights as an open question. This does not mean that they should be immune from revision, but at least they deserve the firmness and stability of something like a constitutional mandate rather than a set of policies that are easily amended. Surely the rights that tend to be the most difficult to protect (such as the rights of minorities to a decent life) are worth treating as a fixed point of departure for judicial officials.

Bell concludes with three insightful chapters on East Asian capitalism. In the first of these, he explores the classical Confucian texts for a clearer understanding of their views on property rights. Bell observes that Mencius endorsed policies of minimal taxation, held that the price of most goods should be determined by the people, and condemned state-imposed import duties. He then draws out some distinctive Confucian constraints on private property rights, including provisions for the material subsistence and moral development of the most disadvantaged, ownership rights that are vested in families rather than individuals, and a stipulation that wealth not be acquired by unscrupulous means.

In including this last constraint Bell might read too much into the classical texts -- the passages he cites only suggest that unscrupulous acquisition is worthy of moral condemnation, not necessarily of regulation. Read as a justification for government regulation, moreover, one wonders whether it wouldn't in fact open the door to a great deal of state intervention, making classical Confucianism much less friendly to free exchange than Bell would like to believe.

In the second chapter of this section, Bell argues that several of the distinctive features of current East Asian capitalism are well suited to the cultural backgrounds and economic circumstances of many East Asian countries, and should be preferred over their East Asian (and paradigmatically American) alternatives. These include allowances for powerful, centralized governments to favor certain industries over others, reliance on social networks for winning employment and facilitating transactions, family-based ownership of businesses, and protection of the needy through primarily "informal" means such as voluntary family care.

The third chapter on capitalism is the most eye-opening. In it, Bell attempts to justify the practice of hiring foreign domestic workers (FDWs) without extending them equal citizenship, thus defending a practice that many liberal democrats find to be morally questionable. Bell's general strategy is to show that the current system is the lesser of many evils. He argues that the unequal status of long-term FDWs is the only viable alternative to large-scale illegal (and unsupervised) employment, and the only way to provide opportunities to a significant number of financially destitute people. Here Bell seems to recommend the status quo as a desperate if woefully inadequate remedy for the greater injustice of global inequality. Although I am deeply ambivalent about Bell's conclusions, which seem to me to condone something like permanent second-class status, this chapter nevertheless offers the most forceful defense of the status quo that I have yet seen.

Having addressed his three pillars of liberal democracy, Bell concludes with a refreshingly candid chapter on methodology. In it, he lists some of the best-known methodological objections that those who work across traditions are likely to encounter, describing them as objections that were routinely raised when he presented versions of the essays found in this volume. Bell then contrasts his understandably defensive "real responses" to these objections with the more thoughtful and diplomatic "ideal responses" that occurred to him long after the debates had concluded. Anyone who works across traditions is sure to sympathize with Bell, and is likely to share at least some of his impatience with various attempts to offer definitive accounts about the proper approach to comparative work.

This collection of essays touches upon the most heated debates about the blending of East Asian and Western traditions. As such it might seem to be a drop in the bucket of an already vast and rich body of literature. But in my view it nevertheless qualifies as one of the most important recent contributions of its kind, for it effectively fills two crucial if somewhat neglected niches in the existing literature. First, it is particularly successful at answering the concerns of scholars who work primarily on Western political thought. These are not essays that will be intelligible only to those who are already steeped in Chinese philosophy or politics. Bell takes great pains to provide his readers with the historical and cultural background necessary to understand his arguments. He also offers interesting accounts of his early, bumbling attempts to come to grips with the concerns and passions of his East Asian students and colleagues, all of which effectively take the reader through many of the revelations that led Bell himself to his current views. As a work that is particularly accessible to specialists in Western politics, Bell's arguments address themselves effectively to the audience that most needs to hear them.

A second distinctive feature of this book is that it injects considerable specificity into a series of debates that are sometimes dominated by sweeping, speculative claims. In this sense Bell stands to much of the existing literature as someone who repairs sinks and steam-pipes might stand to empirically impoverished theories of plumbing. His work will come as a relief to those who prefer to see the comparison and synthesis of complex political traditions in action before drawing grand, theoretical conclusions about how it should be done. For these reasons, Bell's collection of essays is not just a highly stimulating contribution but an indispensable one as well.