Beyond Moral Judgment

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Alice Crary, Beyond Moral Judgment, Harvard University Press, 2007, 256pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0674024575.

Reviewed by Simon Kirchin, University of Kent


Many of us professional philosophers are familiar with books and articles that discuss the various moral judgements that people supposedly make every day.  We might play around with, and reflect on, declarations and thoughts such as 'He is kind', 'She is wicked', 'Don't do that, it's cruel', and 'The right thing is the fair thing'.  Often we take these judgements as our basic resource, probably in all innocence, and move on to develop whatever important thoughts we do.  But, on the face of it, although such judgements might be familiar, we might worry that these stock phrases do not exhaust by any means the moral thinking and sentiments of most people.  We might imagine that their -- our -- everyday moral judgements and imagination are more sophisticated than that.  But, what might these more sophisticated judgments look like?  Certainly we might imagine that many thick concepts are employed, as well as thin ones.  We might also imagine that we categorize people and other things with judgements that have nuanced clauses.  So, not just 'He is kind', but 'He is kind, although he often lacks self-confidence and so his kindness can appear clumsy'.  There might well be other such changes and adaptations we can imagine to such thoughts and claims.  However, there is an important assumption underlying all of this made, perhaps, by many different types of contemporary theorist.  The assumption is that moral judgement and thought are confined simply to those judgements that employ straightforwardly obvious moral concepts such as goodness, kindness, cruelty, and all the rest.  Such concepts might be important, certainly, but they might not be the be all and end all.  Perhaps our moral life finds expression beyond these overtly moral concepts.  And perhaps this shift in our thinking might lead to interesting thoughts regarding some contemporary philosophical debates.

This briefly expressed train of thought is the main idea of Alice Crary's engaging new book.  As she says,

My overarching thesis in this book is that our habits of moral thought and action need to reflect [a] reorientation if we are to do justice to challenges that we confront in trying to overcome limitations of our own moral understanding and in trying to negotiate moral differences that separate us from others.  (11)

In putting forward her thesis she draws on J. L. Austin, Cora Diamond, John McDowell, and Wittgenstein, amongst others, as well as Jane Austen, Theodor Fontane, E. M. Forster, Henry James, and Tolstoy.  In advancing her view, Crary is not content simply to challenge the supposedly widespread assumption from above that moral thought is exhausted by thinking in terms dictated solely by concepts that are obviously moral.  She wishes to build to why this is an important question to ask and explore the various assumptions that feed into the view that she casts as both widespread and mistaken.

In what follows I summarize her arguments, which then leads to my critical train of thought.


Crary begins by thinking about J. L. Mackie's familiar charge that objective prescriptions are queer and she briefly surveys the currently popular responses.  She uses this debate to initiate thoughts about the conception of objectivity that we should adopt in our moral thought.  In effect, she defends a view familiar from the writings of sensibility theorists, such as McDowell, that the conception of objectivity that is appropriate to use in relation to moral discourse and thought is one that in some way encompasses seemingly problematic subjective types of phenomenon, something that a 'narrower' conception of objectivity does not admit.  Such a conception, therefore, is treated as being based on some form of mind- or human-independence.  It embodies an 'abstraction requirement', in that in order to legitimate the subject matter in hand, we are required to "survey the world from a maximally abstract (i.e., dispassionate and dehumanized) vantage point …" (20)  In eschewing the narrow conception of objectivity and embracing a 'wider' conception for moral thought, she argues that we can say that moral judgements and thoughts can well admit of correctness and incorrectness -- and hence in this sense be objective -- even though such standards and forms of correctness need not be based on something outside of human thought and activity.  In her discussion of objectivity, she introduces what she means by a concept:

In speaking here of the use of concepts, I am employing "concept" as a technical term.  In my parlance, a concept is something that determines objectively the same content in different circumstances, and, by the same token, a sound conceptual practice is one that deals in genuine, objective regularities.  Employing this terminology, we can say that it is an implication of the imposition of an abstraction requirement that the regularities constitutive of a sound conceptual practice must transcend the practice in the sense of being discernible independently of any subjective responses characteristic of us as participants in it. (21)

In rejecting the narrow conception of objectivity, she develops a view about Austin's thoughts on language and draws on the rule-following considerations from Wittgenstein and commentators.  In the latter case she emphasizes that Wittgenstein's aim was not -- and our aim following him should not be -- to eschew all talk of objectivity, but rather to rethink what objectivity might be.  In doing so we can see that our concepts are essentially integrated into customs and practices that encourage the relevant sensitivities in us.  Concepts might still be subject to regularities, but these might be apparent, and be both a source of justification and justifiable, only from within a perspective of people who typically use such things.

How do these thoughts about objectivity connect with her challenge to the supposed common assumption regarding moral concepts and judgements?  In brief, she labels her account of concept acquisition and use as 'pragmatic', in the (supposedly straightforward) sense that concepts are picked up and applied in a way that is not subject to any abstraction requirement.  There is no telling ahead of time, nor external to various human interests and sensibilities, what will count as correct mastery or use of a concept.  With this in mind, she adopts a liberal view of how a concept might be employed and developed, and what we might count as correct and incorrect usage.  In doing so she emphasizes the rich network of ways in which we speak and think, that is the rich number of ways in which we might put words and thoughts to use: describing, prescribing, speaking sarcastically, thinking metaphorically, using hyperbole, and so on and so on.  At many times she also talks of the range of emotions and sensitivities people have.  Crary is of the opinion:

(1) that a person's ability to correctly project any -- moral or non-moral -- concept necessarily depends on her possession of a sense of the importance of similarities and differences among some set of its application and (2) that this sense of importance is (a) integral to a practical orientation toward the world that cannot help but encode a moral outlook and therefore also (b) bound to play an either more or less significant role in expressing such an outlook.  In making these allowances, we open the door for cases in which a person is correctly described as engaged in moral thought because, without regard to whether she is using moral or non-moral concepts, she is, in her use of concepts, drawing on a sense of importance that figures significantly in her moral outlook.  These are the kinds of cases I have in mind in insisting on the possibility of moral thinking apart from moral judgment-making. (44)

We can add, then, that Crary thinks that there is no way of isolating exactly which sensibilities and 'senses of importance' matter morally and which do not.  So, some important such sensibilities might be formally expressed using obviously non-moral concepts, but they might still be part of moral thinking in a wider sense, in a sense that she thinks has been forgotten in current philosophy.  Whilst her discussions of Austin and Wittgenstein are designed to support her thoughts about objectivity, she looks to literary figures and their writings to support her liberal view of sensibilities and concepts, emphasizing that arguments, as narrowly understood by many philosophers, are not the only way in which moral change can be effected and that moral understanding can be achieved.  (There is a particularly good summary and discussion of Gilbert Ryle on Austen on this matter.)  She also considers recent work on feminist thought in this regard.

What implications does Crary's view have?  She thinks that it is misguided for an individual to understand his or her moral world in terms that are narrowly moral.  People go wrong if they try to regulate and understand the whole host of feelings that might arise only with reference to (narrowly categorized) moral concepts conceived to exist prior to such emotions.  Not only might this lead to a paucity of moral life in the individual, it might well mean that he or she fails to grow and is not open to changes that can occur when contact is made with others who think and feel differently.  It also means that philosophers will be unable to do justice to what it is to be a moral and evaluating being.  In particular, moral disagreements and agreements will not be characterized correctly, since philosophers too often limit their contours and imagine that such agreement and disagreement consist only in the extent to which people agree in the application of narrowly conceived moral concepts.


Crary's book is stimulating and worthwhile, particularly as it teases out the implications of this supposed assumption reasonably well.  However, I worry about her overall argument.  My worry is not so much that what she says is wrong, but that her presentation of it is less than clear-cut, and perhaps she has over-egged her claim.  Before I discuss that, I make a quick comment about philosophical style and taste, if only as an advert for potential readers.  Much of Crary's aim is to present us with a certain picture of what the moral life is and what we can say about it, and to contrast that with her opponent's picture.  There is a lot of 'teasing out' of ideas but, for my tastes, not enough clear labelling of claims with justifications given explicitly and concisely, let alone any 'arguments by numbered propositions'.  (Given Crary's philosophical claims about the moral life, one might expect this.)  Hence, philosophers looking for clear-cut arguments might feel a little frustrated.  Now, I happen to like Crary's picture -- particularly with regards to her claims about objectivity -- and I am certainly not immune to the charms of philosophy that attempts to persuade in the ways that Crary does.  But, I confess to some frustration.  This lack of clear-cut reasons for key claims feeds into my worrying train of thought.

As mentioned, I am content with her claim about objectivity and happy to move along from it, although others might be less so.  But, another key claim disturbs me and leads to a train of questions to which we do not get direct, explicit answers.  If we allow a wider conception of objectivity, why should we be forced to accept the liberal view that many different types of emotion and sensitivity affect our moral life aside from those emotions conceived to be narrowly, obviously moral?  Why should we think that simply because what counts as a right (or a wrong, or a legitimate, or an interesting, etc.) use of a moral concept can be judged and justified only from inside the practice of evaluating, that therefore all sorts of emotion and sensibility have to be in play?  Why not think instead that an 'internalist' picture of evaluative justifications could not be compatible with the thought that there are certain, distinct moral sorts of emotion and sensitivity, and distinct (and many) non-moral ones, and these inform their respective types of concept alone?  So, there are two precise worries: (i) An acceptance of the wider conception of objectivity does not entail and probably does not imply Crary's liberal view of emotions and sensitivities; and (ii) we are given no distinct reason for the liberal view anyway.  And I say this as one who agrees with Crary's thoughts about moral concepts.

There is an obvious complaint against this sort of challenge, at least as regards (ii).  There is no reason in principle to rule out the alternative to Crary's claim.  But, we should think about how, in fact, humans live and use their concepts.  This is why Crary devotes such a large amount of her book to detailed discussions of various literary works.  The moral lives of the characters, and what we readers can glean from them, depend a great deal on emotions, ways of speaking, and so on that are not straightforwardly moral.

But, then we hit the next stage in my worrying train of thought.  Throughout this review I have talked of concepts that are 'obviously moral' or 'straightforwardly moral'.  Yet, we get little if any sense from Crary of exactly what a moral concept is.  Of course, one can imagine examples; I began this review with some.  But, then, think again about the judgement I gave with the nuanced clauses.  Is 'self-confidence' a moral concept?  Is 'clumsiness'?  Arguably not the latter, although it can have moral implications, but the former could well be.  Why does this matter?  Because in many of her discussions of literary works we get a criss-crossing of concepts, with no clear sense of which ones are moral and which ones are not.  Take, for example, her quoting of Ryle on Austen.  "Elizabeth Bennett combines a dangerous cocksureness in her assessments of people with a proper sense of her own worth.  Jane is quite uncocksure.  She is too diffident.  She does not resent being put upon or even realize that she is being put upon …" (141; originally p. 278 of "Jane Austen and the Moralists", Collected Papers, vol. 1. [Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 1990]).  Ryle continues in this vein, as does Crary throughout her book.  Is 'dangerous cocksuredness' a moral concept?  Is diffidence?

So, there is this criss-crossing of concepts.  But, again, why does this failure to distinguish moral from non-moral concepts matter?  After all, surely this blurring of the concepts is all to Crary's good since all of these concepts are important parts of our moral lives.  Well, that is certainly true.  But, in order for her key and oft-given claim -- 'moral judgements which employ obviously, straightforwardly moral concepts do not exhaust our moral thinking and moral life' -- to be judged as true, and interesting, it is necessary for her to set up a demarcation between moral and non-moral concepts in the first place.  This distinction is necessary for her claim about the (narrowly) non-moral being part of the (widely conceived) moral life to seem interesting.  But this distinction that she often refers to seems to count against, or at least get in the way of, what she really wants to say, namely that the moral life encompasses concepts such as diffidence and dangerous cocksuredness.  Dressing up this claim with some distinction between the moral and the non-moral might cause confusion for we might think that there is some internal contradiction.  This lack of clarity is compounded by the fact that she often talks of emotions and sensitivities feeding into our use of concepts, but does not go beyond that and spell out clearly the ways in which such emotions might do so.  Again, we get literary examples -- which I am all in favour of, I should add -- with a few cases scattered around that might be suggestions of how this can happen.  But there is no clear listing or definitive statement, say, of what she means by emotions and sensitivities affecting our concepts.  Similarly, we get no detailed treatment of an emotion that might be clearly moral and one that might be clearly non-moral, and how the two might effect moral judgement and moral life.

An extra thought in this vein concerns the opposition.  Perhaps I am being too harsh on Crary.  Perhaps she feels the need to talk often about the distinction between the moral and the non-moral simply because so many people assume there to be such a distinction and forget about the non-moral when thinking about our moral lives, in the way set out in my summary.  In fact, I am sure that this has a lot to do with it.  But, then we can raise this question:  Is Crary right that most philosophers concentrate exclusively on concepts that are obviously moral, that they think further that this exhausts the moral life, and that she is in some small minority?  Again, aside from spelling out in very general terms what an opponent might claim, we get no detailed discussion of the people she has in her sights, at least nothing to the level of detail required for the importance of this claim (to my mind, at least).  No contemporary philosopher or type of philosophy is discussed, and no figure from the past.  Although I began this review with some stock phrase judgements, we might wonder exactly how often books and articles concentrate exclusively on such judgements.  In recent years there has been a great deal of work published on various character traits and emotions and how they affect our concepts, our motivations, and our judgements.  Just think of the work on virtue ethics, be it directed on Aristotle or otherwise.  Just think of the 'rediscovering' of Kantian moral psychology in the last few decades, and how rich Kant's insights into the moral life are beyond the Groundwork.  Just think of the interest shown in the relation between thin and thick concepts.  It requires only quick reflection to see that the difference between 'obviously' moral concepts, such as compassion and selfishness, and supposed non-moral concepts such as diffidence or cocksuredness, is small or nonexistent, and some who have written about these concepts have made this point.  Of course, there are plenty of writers who concentrate exclusively on moral concepts -- often enhanced with single quotation marks -- such as 'ought', 'duty', 'right', and 'good', and some might fall foul of Crary's worry.  But, sometimes the concentration is designed simply to put forward important connections between other moral concepts (the relation between right and ought, say), and the fact that people do not also locate the use of such concepts within a rich social network or moral psychology need not mean they are necessarily falling foul of Crary's thoughts.  Similarly, for example, consequentialists might often focus on what sort of thing should be maximized in order for an action to be deemed right.  But, when tackled about the problems that a consequentialist mind-set might bring when considering one's relations with friends or family, say, I have often read nice little vignettes from consequentialists where they imagine consequentialist agents thinking through and feeling all sorts of things.  Such little episodes seem to me to be in line with the sort of thing that Crary is insisting on, namely that what might count as right or good can be affected by all sorts of emotion and feeling that are not overtly moral.  People who might seem to be the opposition are perfectly at home thinking and writing in line with Crary's thoughts.

So, in the absence of a detailed description and discussion of her opponents, the suspicion is that Crary has invented something of a bogey man in order to make her claim seem more interesting.  Are there really that many philosophers who think that the moral life is exhausted by moral judgements and concepts narrowly conceived?  And this invention is a shame, since, as I have said, her claim seems right.  Our moral life does draw on all sorts of emotion and feeling and all sorts of concepts, and her literary illustrations show her claim to be right.

Readers of this review might gather that many of my critical points are of the sort 'I would have done this differently', and that is not such a fatal criticism.  Also, I am clearly more optimistic about contemporary philosophy than Crary is, and perhaps I am wrong.  Whatever the case, reading Crary's book has forced me to think a little more deeply about moral and non-moral concepts, and that is surely a good thing.  I am sure I will be pulling it down from my shelves again before too long.