Beyond Rigidity: The Unfinished Semantic Agenda of Naming and Necessity

Placeholder book cover

Soames, Scott, Beyond Rigidity: The Unfinished Semantic Agenda of Naming and Necessity, Oxford University Press, 2002, 392pp, $37.50 (hbk), ISBN 0195145283.

Reviewed by Genoveva Marti , London School of Economics


Saul Kripke’s 1970 lectures on Naming and Necessity [N&N] shattered descriptivism, a semantic picture that had until then enjoyed the status of practically undisputed doctrine. Kripke argued that proper names, unlike the descriptions that were taken to be associated with them, are rigid and, moreover, that the descriptive information that speakers connect to a proper name does not determine the referent. But Kripke’s attack on descriptivism goes beyond proper names. Until 1970 most semanticists would have endorsed a form of descriptivism as regards terms for kinds, a view according to which what speakers are talking about when they use expressions such as ‘gold’ or ‘cat’, what is expressed by uses of sentences containing those terms, and what the truth conditions of those sentences are, is determined by descriptive information associated with the terms in question. Saul Kripke challenged descriptivism on this front also, arguing that such terms are rigid and that in any case the descriptive information associated with them does not determine their domain of application. One of the main lessons of Beyond Rigidity is that Kripke’s arguments in N&N constitute an all-out rejection of descriptivism, and that attempts to revive the doctrine and circumvent Kripke’s objections will not succeed. Following the two fronts of attack in N&N, Soames’ book is organized in two parts: after an introductory chapter that situates the discussion, chapters 2 to 8 focus on proper names and chapters 9 to 11 discuss general terms.

Kripke suggested a positive non-descriptivist picture of how reference is determined and how meaning is preserved and transmitted (the so called ‘causal-historical picture’ also presented by Donnellan), but most of the semantic conclusions of N&N are negative. Positive aspects and bits of a theory of meaning inspired by, or germane to, basic theses put forward in N&N multiplied and flourished afterwards as different authors developed portions and details of the new theory that came to be known as Direct Reference. In this story Scott Soames’ book fills two important gaps. On the one hand, the book connects some fundamental theses of Direct Reference theory to the source that motivated and ignited the movement. On the other, Soames completes the discussion of theses that at the time were only partly developed by Kripke.

I expect the following goes without saying, but it won’t hurt to stress two points: first, the aim of the book is not just to ground in Kripke’s theories about rigidity a bunch of theses more or less universally accepted by proponents of Direct Reference. Although some of the claims put forward in the book have been previously defended by Direct Reference theorists, the author himself among others, Soames argues here for a specific conception of the theory and a specific view of the semantics of names, propositional-attitude reports and natural-kind terms that has been, and will very likely continue to be, debated inside and out of the Direct Reference tradition.

Secondly, although Soames’ discussion clarifies and focuses some central arguments of N&N (in fact, parts of the book, especially chapters 1, 2 and 9, would be a good complement for a neophyte reader of Kripke’s work) the aim of the book is not exegetical. In the process of articulating precisely the semantic theory that stems from N&N Soames makes decisions that lead him to contradict claims commonly accepted as having been pretty much established by Kripke’s work. A particularly crucial move in this regard is the decision to present the positive theory of the semantic content of proper names in terms of their contribution to propositions, a way of framing the discussion that is conspicuously absent in N&N. After all, Kripke’s work emerges in the midst of the tradition of intensional semantics, a tradition in which answers about the semantic function of expressions are given in terms of their denotation or extension with respect to different circumstances of evaluation. Throughout the book, when it comes to particularly central arguments Soames takes care to present theses using both the propositionless language of N&N and the formulation in terms of propositional constituents. But it immediately transpires that the differences go beyond formulation. In N&N Kripke had used identity sentences such as ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ as prime examples of the necessary a posteriori. However, the view endorsed by Soames that the semantic content, i.e., the propositional contribution, of a name is its referent, and his claim that propositions are the objects of assertion and belief, lead to the conclusion that the proposition semantically expressed by ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ is the same as the proposition expressed by ‘Hesperus is Hesperus’ and thus knowable a priori. In chapter 1 Soames points out the flaw in the reasoning that appears to support the conclusion of a posterioricity, but what he regards as the real culprit that provokes that and similar confusions is the allegedly intuitive datum that one can believe or know that Hesperus is Hesperus without believing or knowing that Hesperus is Phosphorus: “[i]n the presence of my proposed relational analysis of propositional attitudes and attitude ascriptions, this alleged datum leads to the conclusion that sentences that differ only in the substitution of coreferential proper names may semantically express different propositions” (p. 13). And so in the first part of Beyond Rigidity Soames proceeds to offer a positive theory of assertion, belief and belief attribution that identifies the semantic content of a name with its referent and explains the appearance of plausibility of the alleged intuitive datum.

Chapter 2, an expanded version of Soames’ article ‘The Modal Argument: Wide Scope and Rigidified Descriptions’ (Noûs, 1998:1-22), discusses Kripke’s arguments against descriptivism, focusing in particular on the Modal Argument and its application to two descriptivist attempts to preserve the semantic connection between names and descriptions, the proposal that names behave like descriptions that always take wider scope and the proposal to treat names as rigidified descriptions. Chapters 3 and 4 present and defend the view that the semantic content, and thus the propositional contribution, of a name is its referent. The semantic content of a sentence s is characterized by Soames as the “common core of information that is asserted and conveyed by utterances of s across different contexts.” In the case of a proper name n “the proposition semantically expressed by a sentence Fn … is the singular Russellian proposition that predicates the property expressed by F of the referent of n.” (p. 204). Soames stresses here the importance of distinguishing the semantic content of a sentence from the information the sentence conveys in a particular occasion of use. Asserting is something that agents do, and, because of the background assumptions and shared knowledge that operate in a conversational setting, a speaker who uses a sentence in a given context will typically assert more propositions than just the proposition that constitutes the semantic content of the sentence in that context; among those the speaker may succeed in conveying and asserting descriptive information. On Soames’ view the motivation for descriptivism lies partly in the failure to distinguish semantic content from other types of information. This distinction is central in Soames’ approach, and it figures prominently in the defense of the relational theory of attitude reports presented in chapters 6-8, for it explains the intuition that attributions of belief that differ only in the substitution of coreferential proper names may still differ in truth value. The root of that allegedly intuitive datum is, according to Soames, the fact that belief attributions such as ‘Mary believes that Hesperus is a planet’ and ‘Mary believes that Phosphorus is a planet’, that semantically do express a relation between Mary and one and the same Russellian proposition, can each be used by speakers to assert relations between the agent and other propositions that typically contain descriptive material, resulting in attributions that may differ in truth value.

As part of the defense of a purely relational theory of attitude reports, Soames criticizes in detail two proposals (by Mark Richard and by Richard Larson and Peter Ludlow) that interpret attitude attributions as relations between an agent and a ‘linguistically enhanced’ proposition, i.e., a proposition that contains among its constituents the words used in the subordinate clause or a representation associated with them, proposals that allow for two ascriptions to a given agent to differ in truth value even when the subordinate clauses semantically express the same proposition. The chapter contains an Appendix—which the author suggests to skip if the reader is not interested—in further criticism of Richard’s approach, but the presentation is extremely clear and detailed, so there is very little reason to skip it.

Perhaps this part of the book would have benefited from discussion of how the proposal explains cases in which speakers are bound to make attributions of contradictory beliefs and to make contradictory attributions of beliefs, as when, for instance, reporting an agent who utters sincerely ‘Cicero was an orator, but Tully was not’, cases that have been used also as motivation for views like Richard’s or for approaches that take attitude ascriptions to express three-place relations. Soames’ analysis of attitude reports is one of several different proposals in contention within the tradition of Direct Reference, and it will probably continue to generate a lot discussion and responses, from the targets of his criticisms as well as from other theorists who reject the purely relational analysis he endorses.

Soames is often characterized as a radical Millian, so his contention that some names are partly descriptive (chapter 5) may come as a surprise. Although simple proper names do not have any descriptive content, Soames argues that some complex names such as ‘Princess Diana’ or ‘Princeton University’ are semantically associated with descriptive information that, typically, applies only contingently to their bearers. The semantic content of the sentence ‘Princess Diana was blonde’ is the content of ‘[the x: x was a Princess & x = d] x blonde’ where ‘d’ is a logically proper name for Diana Spencer. These names, like standard proper names and other rigid terms, do not designate any object other than their actual designatum with respect to any possible world. However, with respect to a counterfactual situation in which Diana Spencer exists but never becomes a Princess, ‘Princess Diana’ does not designate anything at all. So, on this proposal partly descriptive names are, strictly speaking, not rigid. Soames’ arguments for this view and his discussion of potential objections and alternatives make the theory highly plausible. I still think (in die-hard Millian fashion) that, in spite of the explicit presence of descriptive material, these names are much closer to standard proper names than Soames’ approach suggests. Suppose that we were to discover that Diana Spencer never really married Charles and so that in fact she never was a Princess. On Soames’ approach past uses of ‘Princess Diana’, literally, would not have referred to anyone. But I do not think our discovery would prompt us to conclude that when speakers have uttered ‘Princess Diana has a beautiful smile’ they did not refer to, and they did not assert a proposition about, the woman that waved from balconies and coaches. And I think that we would conclude something similar about the institution whose sign at the main entrance reads ‘Princeton University’ were we to discover that the institution was largely a sophisticated hologram hiding a Martian spaceport. The reason is the same one that operates in the Dartmouth case: were we to discover that Dartmouth never was really at the mouth of the Dart, it would not follow that we had not been referring to the city all the previous times when we used ‘Dartmouth’. It is in this particular regard that names differ from authentic descriptive terms, for the latter simply do not apply to an object that does not satisfy the attributive content. The point, on my view, is that once an expression has, by whatever means, acquired a life as a name, a device whose semantic function is to make an object the subject of discourse, any descriptive material that might at any point have been connected to the expression does not play any role in determining who or what speakers are talking about when they use the term.

The second main theme of Beyond Rigidity is the discussion of Kripke’s claim that some general terms are, like proper names, rigid designators. Kripke argues that certain predicates such as ‘tiger’ or ‘water’, some terms for natural phenomena such as ‘heat’ and ‘sound’ and adjectives like ‘hot’ and ‘loud’ “have a greater kinship with proper names than is generally realized” (N&N, p. 134). According to Kripke those terms are rigid, and consequently theoretical identities expressed by sentences such as ‘water is H2O’ or ‘heat is the motion of molecules’ are examples of the necessary a posteriori. The problem, Soames points out, is that the definition of rigidity that applies to singular terms is not directly applicable to general terms, and nowhere in N&N is there a characterization of what it is for a general term to be rigid. So this is the first order of business undertaken in chapter 9 of Beyond Rigidity. Soames argues that the general terms under discussion function primarily as predicates, not as names for abstract entities, so the question to address is what it is for a predicate to be rigid. Soames considers and ends up rejecting two strategies to extend the notion of rigidity to predicates: one is to take a predicate to be rigid just in case it expresses an essential property; the other is to define the rigidity of a predicate in terms of its association to a singular term that denotes rigidly a kind. The attempt to define a rigid predicate as one that stands for the same property with respect to every possible world is considered and quickly dismissed on the basis that it would make any predicate trivially rigid, for any predicate F stands for the property being-an-F. Chapter 9 concludes that there is no completely satisfactory definition of rigidity for predicates. This is perhaps too hasty a conclusion, a point to which I return below, but in any case Soames, rightly I think, directs the discussion away from the question of rigidity and towards the more fundamental question that is raised by Kripke’s discussion of general terms: “is there any semantic property of natural kind predicates that is importantly similar to a corresponding property of proper names, and that can be used to explain why, in the case of many ‘theoretical identification sentences’ involving such predicates, we can be confident that they are necessary if true?” (p. 263). Here Soames stresses again that anti-descriptivism, both for names and kind predicates, is the crux of Kripke’s arguments in N&N. What names and kind predicates have in common is the lack of descriptive content and the way in which their reference and their extension is determined.

Soames treats theoretical identification sentences as conditionals or bi-conditionals, and he offers a theory that explains why identification sentences involving simple predicates that designate kinds of the same type are necessary, if true, on purely linguistic grounds. The theory distinguishes sentences like (*) ‘all drops of water are drops of a substance with molecular composition H2O’, whose necessity follows from their truth on linguistic grounds, from sentences that involve predicates for kinds of different type, such as ‘whales are mammals’ ,whose necessity depends on the nature and essential properties of the kind and its members. As regards the epistemic status of theoretical identifications, Soames proposes to distinguish the kind designated by a predicate (which he identifies with an intension) from the properties the predicate expresses. This distinction is essentially the same one we draw for singular terms. For simple predicates, such as ‘water’ or ‘elm’, the semantic content is the kind designated. As in the case of proper names, designatum and propositional constituent coincide. But when it comes to complex expressions, be it ‘the inventor of bifocals’ or ‘is a substance with molecular composition H2O’, what is expressed, the attributive complex that constitutes the propositional constituent, is different from what is designated, an individual or a kind. This allows Soames to argue that (*) above and ‘all drops of water are drops of water’ express different propositions, and thus to justify the epistemic status of (*) as a posteriori. The propositions expressed by sentences such as ‘woodchucks are groundhogs’, are however, a priori, and the explanation of the appearance of a posterioricity is an extension of the explanation given by Soames in the case of ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’.

Going back to the conclusion of chapter 9, it seems to me that Soames’ approach provides the basis for a definition of rigidity for kind predicates. A compound predicate like ‘is a substance with molecular composition H2O’ expresses a complex property that determines a kind as designatum; in this case the kind designated is arguably (for metaphysical reasons) the same with respect to every index, and thus the predicate is rigid. But if the predicate is ‘fills rivers and lakes’ or ‘is Mary’s favorite substance’ the kind designated may well vary from index to index.

The analysis of the semantic content of kind predicates is also used to explain their function as singular terms for kinds. For both types of uses Soames introduces a distinction that explains the conflicting interpretations of sentences such as ‘ice is water’; on an expansive interpretation of the terms ‘water’ and ‘ice’ the sentence is true; but on a restrictive interpretation the terms are governed by stipulations as regards their status as liquids or solids, and thus on that interpretation the sentence is false. This, and the representation of theoretical identifications as conditionals, provides a response to a puzzle proposed by Mark Johnston (the fact that what appears to be an absurd conclusion ‘water is ice’ seems to follow from the apparently unobjectionable premises ‘water is H2O’ and ‘ice is H2O’).

There has been a lot of discussion in the literature of Kripke’s, and also Putnam’s, views about natural kind terms, but the discussion has not typically been framed as fundamentally an issue about the semantic similarities between names and certain predicates. In general, this terrain has been much less scrutinized than the subject of proper names, which is perhaps the reason why in these chapters we find a lot more exploration of different alternatives, sometimes without the definitive expression of a final positive commitment. In any case, it is to be expected that the alternative explanations considered by Soames and the issues that he identifies as the main points of contention will frame a lot of the future discussion of these issues.

There are a few (very few I think) typos in the text that are not likely to produce misunderstandings but that should be corrected in subsequent editions: a ‘the’ that should be ‘that’ on p. 230; two ‘x’s missing in (20) and (21) on p. 262; and an indicative ‘includes’ that should be a subjunctive on p. 304. A final warning: all the footnotes are at the end of the book. This may have some justification because some of the notes are long and they would run through more than one page. But readers who, like this reviewer, find going back and forth a real torture, may feel tempted to skip some of the notes (especially after finding that a few of the trips to the outback only produce a page citation). The advice is: don’t. The notes are very much part of the discussion, and some of them introduce important side issues.