Beyond Selflessness: Reading Nietzsche's Genealogy

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Christopher Janaway, Beyond Selflessness: Reading Nietzsche's Genealogy, Oxford University Press, 2007, 284pp., $49.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199279692.

Reviewed by Brian Leiter, University of Texas, Austin


Christopher Janaway proposes to "transmit something of the richness and reward to be found in reading Nietzsche's texts themselves" (p. 2). In the hands of a scholar less skilled than Janaway, such a proclamation would be a red flag to the philosophical reader that a lot of bad paraphrase and mimicry of Nietzsche's writing style was in the offing. There is, happily, none of the latter, and very little of the former, in this intelligent and illuminating book, which aims to defend two rather precise theses about reading Nietzsche's On the Genealogy of Morality: first, that Nietzsche's method of writing is intended to engage the reader emotionally or affectively; and second, that such affective engagement is a necessary precondition for altering the reader's views about evaluative questions -- that "without the rhetorical provocations, without the revelation of what we find gruesome, shaming, embarrassing, comforting, and heart-warming we would neither comprehend nor be able to revalue our current values" (p. 4; cf. pp. 96-98).

Both theses seem obviously correct and also worth emphasizing. But from them Janaway wants to draw other, more controversial interpretive morals. In particular, Janaway believes that it is wrong to treat Nietzsche's writing style as "mere modes of presentation, detachable in principle from some elusive set of propositions to which his philosophy might be thought to consist," since to do so, "is to miss a great part of Nietzsche's real importance to philosophy" (p. 4). "Nietzsche's way of writing," he explains, "addresses our affects, feelings, or emotions. It provokes sympathies, antipathies, and ambivalences that lie in the modern psyche below the level of rational decision and impersonal argument." This, Janaway says, is "not some gratuitous exercise in 'style' that could be edited out of Nietzsche's thought" (p. 4).

These, and similar passages in Janaway's book,[1] seem to confuse Nietzsche's practical (or therapeutic[2]) objectives and his philosophical positions. There can be no doubt that Nietzsche's practical objective is to transform the complacent consciousness of (at least some of) his readers about the received morality, and it seems equally clear that he thinks the only way to do that is by engaging them emotionally. Yet the proposition that readers will only change their most basic moral commitments if their underlying affective states are altered is a philosophical position that can be stated unemotionally, as Janaway himself often does. What Janaway fails to establish is that one can not, in fact, separate out Nietzsche's philosophical positions (about agency, motivation, the origins of morality, etc.) from the mode of presentation that is essential to his therapeutic aims.

Consider the analogous case of Freudian psychoanalysis. Unlike Nietzsche, of course, Freud's books had no therapeutic aim: therapy took place in the psychoanalyst's office. Freud's books, by contrast, expressed the cognitive content of his philosophical or theoretical positions: about the structure of the mind, the interpretation of dreams, the course of human psychic development and -- most importantly for our purposes -- the centrality of the mechanism of transference to therapeutic success. Yet a correct theoretical description of transference is no substitute for the patient's actual experience of transference in the therapeutic setting, when he projects onto the analyst the heretofore repressed feelings that had been the source of his suffering, thus permitting the patient to recognize the reality of those feelings at last.

I assume no one denies that one can separate the theoretical account of transference as a therapeutic mechanism from the actual experience of cure via psychoanalysis culminating (more or less) with the moment of transference. Nietzsche differs from Freud in many respects, but only one that matters in this context: his books are both the expression of the theoretical position and the therapeutic method. Nietzsche's theoretical positions -- e.g., what he thinks explains the genesis of our current morality, how he understands the mechanisms of human psychology, what he takes to be the causal consequences of moral beliefs, and so on -- are both explicit and implicit in a text that also aims to produce a therapeutic effect on certain readers, i.e., to free them from their false consciousness about the dominant morality. Just as successful therapeutic transference requires the patient to experience the repressed feelings directed at the analyst, so too a successful revaluation of values requires engaging the reader sub-consciously at the affective level, so that he feels revulsion, disgust, and embarrassment about his existing moral beliefs. From none of this, alas, does it follow that one can not separate out philosophical or cognitive content from the therapeutic technique. Janaway himself does it throughout his learned book which, like every informative book about Nietzsche, is not written in the style of Nietzsche. Yet, without a doubt, Janaway gives us the best description in the secondary literature of Nietzsche's style and its connection to his therapeutic aims.

I should acknowledge, before going further, that significant portions of Janaway's book involve reactions to, or criticisms of, my Nietzsche on Morality (Leiter 2002), and that he and I have been debating (in print and in person) our disagreements, real and apparent, over the last decade. The agreements, though, are very substantial. Janaway agrees with me that Nietzsche is a naturalist (though seems to disagree about how to characterize that naturalism -- more on that shortly); that "Nietzsche is seeking truths" (p. 3); that he believes "that morality is inimical to human flourishing and progress, in particular the prospering of higher types of human being" (p. 3); that "we are not essentially rational or essentially unified or essentially known to ourselves" (p. 4); that Nietzsche "pursues truths about psychology and history through the book" (p. 6; cf. pp. 21, 96-97); that "knowing or hypothesizing the conditions of the origin of our values is distinct from, and instrumental towards, the critique or revaluation of values that Nietzsche hopes will take place" (p. 10); that "what interests Nietzsche is the type of psychological state … that can explain why a type of personality in a type of predicament adopts a type of values" (pp. 11-12); that Nietzsche is concerned with "what it is to be the most excellent type of human being, to lead the best life a human being can lead" (p. 30); and that what I had earlier (Leiter 1994) critiqued as "the Received View" of Nietzsche's perspectivism is no longer plausible (p. 203). In the end, some of the differences are less significant than Janaway, at times, seems to believe, and much (not, to be sure, all) that he argues is complementary to themes I have emphasized in my own work on Nietzsche. Janaway's book will, without doubt, prove instructive and essential reading not just to readers sympathetic to the naturalistic reading of Nietzsche I have defended, and not just to those interested in Nietzsche's Genealogy, but to all scholars of Nietzsche, regardless of their philosophical and interpretive starting points.

Chapter 1 introduces Janaway's main themes, including the confusion between therapeutic aims and philosophical positions already noted, but also his thesis that Nietzsche's central target is Schopenhauer's moral ideal of "selflessness," which Nietzsche finds not only in morality but also in the unconditional value we moderns assign to truth. Chapter 2 is a painstaking analysis of the "Preface" of the Genealogy, introducing the ways in which Nietzsche frames the book as a rejoinder to a similar book by his former friend, Paul Rée. In Chapter 3, Janaway criticizes my account of Nietzsche's naturalism, offering his own modified account of the role of philosophical naturalism in Nietzsche's work. (I return to that, below.) Chapter 4 is a learned discussion of why Schopenhauer's (bizarre) metaphysical doctrines lead him to treat "selflessness" as an ideal and also of Nietzsche's criticism of Mitleid (compassion, or 'pity' as it is often rendered in English), including a quite plausible hypothesis about why Nietzsche's doctrine of eternal return must involve eternity (see esp. p. 71). Chapter 5 is a meticulous documentation (that sometimes loses sight of philosophical import) of the ways in which Essay I of the Genealogy is a response to the views of his friend Rée.

Chapter 6 returns to the question of Nietzsche's "style," using the First Essay of the Genealogy as a quite effective case study of Nietzsche's therapeutic technique and how Nietzsche "prompts the reader to become conscious of himself or herself as a inheritor of affects whose origin is 'slavish'" (p. 101) and, through the crucial section 14 of the Essay, "enacts disgust on the reader's behalf … with a specific and complex object: that a system of values which exists to fulfill (in imagination) the drive towards power should falsely pass itself off as in opposition to the drive towards power" (pp. 105-6).[3] Chapter 7 examines Nietzsche's view of free will in the Genealogy, arguing against my attribution of "fatalism" to Nietzsche and defending what is now the received wisdom of the "Birkbeck-Southampton axis" (Ken Gemes, Simon May, David Owen, Aaron Ridley, and Janaway), namely, that a single passage, section 2 of the Second Essay, on "the sovereign individual" contains the key to Nietzsche's alleged conception of human "free will." (I shall also return to this issue, below.) Chapter 8 examines the Second Essay of the Genealogy, taking the controversial position (against Mathias Risse, Simon May, myself, and others) that "bad conscience" is, in fact, the same thing as "consciousness of guilt" in the Second Essay, as well as arguing that feelings of guilt are "a means of punishing oneself, and punishment originates in the debtor-creditor relationship" (p. 134).

Chapter 9 posits the "will to power" as the central explanatory mechanism at work in all three essays of the Genealogy. The explanatory role of will to power seems uncontroversial (as I have also argued) with respect to the Third Essay -- where Nietzsche tells us that "every animal … instinctively strives for an optimum of favorable conditions under which it can vent its power completely and attain its maximum feeling of power" (III:7) -- but Janaway argues that the same is true of the first two essays where, for example,

[T]he slaves' invention of the good-evil opposition and labeling of themselves as good is driven by the need to overpower the powerful in a more subtle and underhand way, and the imposition of guilty bad conscience on ourselves is an inward deflection of cruelty, the instinct to release power at the expense of something else. The interiority, complexity, conceptual sophistication, and subsequent rationalization of these moral phenomena disguises the sameness of their origins with [the] brutality [of the masters] and [the human instinct for] cruelty, and Nietzsche's unmasking of these disguises is a project that unifies the Genealogy. (pp. 144-145)

Janaway is perhaps less worried than he should be that "using the notion of will to power in these many forms of psychological explanation" (p. 147) -- even more than those noted in the paragraph, above -- renders the actual content of the concept of "power" suspect, and that its plasticity becomes fatal to its intelligibility when it turns out that "will to power" is also supposed to be "import[ed] … into the biological realm" (p. 149).[4] Janaway concedes to Maudemarie Clark (1990) that it is a mistake to read Nietzsche too literally or metaphysically about will to power, but he follows John Richardson (1996) in thinking we should treat "will to power" as stating a quasi-empirical thesis about the telic disposition of drives. In response to Clark's further claim that (as Janaway puts it) "Nietzsche wants to show us his own value-preferences by producing a kind of mock cosmology which [unlike other philosophers who do the same thing] he does not put forward as true" (p. 161), Janaway says that the simple idea that power is valuable "fails to do justice to … the range of human phenomena that Nietzsche attempts to explain through will to power" (p. 162), many of which Nietzsche does not approve of -- a point which, alas, begs the question against someone like Clark who is skeptical precisely that will to power is being employed in this fashion!

Chapter 10 is a rather overwrought defense of the now familiar claim (also defended by Maudemarie Clark and John Wilcox) that when Nietzsche says (in the Preface) that the Third Essay is an example of the "art of interpretation" with respect to the aphorism at its start, he is referring to section 1 of the Third Essay, and not the odd sentence-length epigram from Zarathustra to the effect that "wisdom … is a woman, she always loves only a warrior," with which the Third Essay begins.[5] Chapters 11-13 examine the Third Essay's critique of "disinterested" knowledge and the overvaluation of truth, and set out Nietzsche's alternative "perspectival" account of knowledge and objectivity, all the while situating these themes, skillfully, against the backdrop of Nietzsche's reaction to Schopenhauer and Kant. Janaway's explanation (pp. 209-210) of the role of "affects" in the kind of knowledge the Genealogy aspires to impart on select readers is especially insightful, as is the explication of the connection between knowing and Nietzsche's attack on the idea of the unitary subject (pp. 213 ff.). These chapters should be required reading for anyone who still wants to write about Nietzsche's "theory" (if he has one!) of knowledge. Chapter 14 concludes with some rather general and at time ephemeral reflections on what it is we should learn about morality from the Genealogy, including (alas!) such pop-psychological drivel as that Nietzsche recommends "a maximally positive attitude towards oneself as an individual, considered as standing apart from others" (p. 253). The book might have ended profitably after the illuminating Chapter 13 on the connection between the "will to truth" and the ascetic ideal.

Let me now examine in greater detail just two of the themes noted above. Before launching into his critique of my reading of Nietzsche as a philosophical naturalist, Janaway claims that most Nietzsche scholars now accept that Nietzsche is a naturalist in what Janaway calls the "broad sense":

He opposes transcendental metaphysics, whether that of Plato or Christianity or Schopenhauer. He rejects notions of the immaterial soul, the absolutely free controlling will, or the self-transparent pure intellect, instead emphasizing the body, talking of the animal nature of human beings, and attempting to explain numerous phenomena by invoking drives, instincts, and affects which he locates in our physical, bodily existence. Human beings are to be "translated back into nature," since otherwise we falsify their history, their psychology, and the nature of their values -- concerning all of which we must know truths, as a means to the all-important revaluation of values. This is Nietzsche's naturalism in the broad sense, which will not be contested here. (p. 34)

This is less a "broad sense" of naturalism, however, than it is "Laundry List Naturalism." Why are these views a philosophical naturalist ought to hold? What is it that makes these the views of a philosophical naturalist at all? Janaway has no clear account.

My aim, in earlier work, was to make some philosophical sense of why Janaway's Laundry List Naturalism, in fact, seems descriptively adequate to many things Nietzsche says. I suggested that underlying this Laundry List Naturalism was, in fact, a kind of familiar "Methodological Naturalism" (hereafter "M-Naturalism"), according to which "philosophical inquiry … should be continuous with empirical inquiry in the sciences" (Leiter 2002: 3). Many philosophers are and have been Methodological Naturalists, but to understand Nietzsche, everything turns on the precise kind of M-Naturalism at issue. I emphasized two commitments of Nietzsche's M-Naturalism. First, I claimed that Nietzsche is what I called a Speculative M-Naturalist, that is, a philosopher, like Hume, who wants to "construct theories that are 'modeled' on the sciences … in that they take over from science the idea that natural phenomena have deterministic causes" (Leiter 2002: 5). Speculative M-Naturalists do not, of course, appeal to actual causal mechanisms that have been well-confirmed by the sciences: if they did, they would not need to speculate! Rather, the idea is that their speculative theories of human nature are informed by the sciences and a scientific picture of how things work. Here, for example, is Stroud's influential formulation of Hume's Speculative M-Naturalism:

[Hume] wants to do for the human realm what he thinks natural philosophy, especially in the person of Newton, had done for the rest of nature.

Newtonian theory provided a completely general explanation of why things in the world happen as they do. It explains various and complicated physical happenings in terms of relatively few extremely general, perhaps universal, principles. Similarly, Hume wants a completely general theory of human nature to explain why human beings act, think, perceive and feel in all the ways they do … .

[T]he key to understanding Hume's philosophy is to see him as putting forward a general theory of human nature in just the way that, say, Freud or Marx did. They all seek a general kind of explanation of the various ways in which men think, act, feel and live … . The aim of all three is completely general -- they try to provide a basis for explaining everything in human affairs. And the theories they advance are all, roughly, deterministic. (Stroud 1977: 3, 4)

So Hume models his theory of human nature on Newtonian science by aiming to identify a few basic, general principles that will provide a broadly deterministic explanation of human phenomena, much as Newtonian mechanics did for physical phenomena. Yet the Humean theory is still speculative, because its claims about human nature are not confirmed in anything resembling a scientific manner, nor do they even win support from any contemporaneous science of Hume's day.

Nietzsche's Speculative M-Naturalism obviously differs from Hume's in some respects: Nietzsche, for example, appears to be a skeptic about determinism based on his professed (if not entirely cogent) skepticism about laws of nature. Yet Nietzsche, like Hume, has a sustained interest in explaining why "human beings act, think, perceive and feel" as they do, especially in the broadly ethical domain. Like Hume, Nietzsche proffers a speculative psychology, though as I have argued in my more recent work, Nietzschean speculations seem to fare rather well in light of subsequent research in empirical psychology. And this speculative psychology (as well as the occasional physiological explanations he offers in passing) appears to give us causal explanations for various human phenomena, which, even if not law-governed, seem to have a deterministic character.

But I also emphasized a second aspect of Nietzsche's M-Naturalism. As I noted, some M-Naturalists demand a kind of "results continuity" with existing science: "philosophical theories" should, they believe, "be supported or justified by the results of the sciences" (Leiter 2002: 4). I argued, however, there is only one kind of "results continuity" at work in Nietzsche, namely, the result that the German Materialists of his day thought followed from advances in physiology, namely, "that man is not of a 'higher … [or] different origin' than the rest of nature" (Leiter 2002: 7). Arguably, Nietzsche's one bit of "Substantive Naturalism" -- meaning "the (ontological) view that the only things that exist are natural" [Leiter 2002: 5] -- is a consequence of this "results continuity" (he had in mind the developments in 19th-century physiology which appeared to support the view that all kinds of conscious experiences and attitudes had physiological explanations). Janaway, however, objects that "the status of this as a 'result' is perhaps debatable: it is hard to say whether the exclusively empirical nature of humanity was a conclusion or an assumption of scientific investigation in the nineteenth century or at any time" (p. 37). This is surprising. If one discovers that conscious experiences have a neurophysiological explanation, or an explanation in terms of the biochemistry of the brain, hasn't one adduced some evidence that bears on whether man is of a "higher or different origin" than the rest of nature? Our consciousness and our capacity for self-reflection, for spirituality, for "inwardness" are all among the typical phenomena appealed to as evidence of our "higher" or "different" nature, perhaps as glimpses of our immaterial "soul" even. If, in fact, they are explicable through processes and mechanisms that are operative in other parts of the natural world, is that not at least defeasible evidence that we are not of "a higher or different origin" than other natural things?

In any case, by introducing Nietzsche's naturalism within a broader typology of kinds of naturalism, I appear to have sowed confusion with Janaway, who purports to consider my account in some detail. He objects:

[N]o scientific support or justification is given -- or readily imaginable -- for the central explanatory hypotheses that Nietzsche gives for the origins of our moral beliefs and attitudes. For a prominent test case, take Nietzsche's hypothesis in the Genealogy's First Treatise that the labeling of non-egoistic inaction, humility, and compassion as "good" began because there were socially inferior classes of individuals in whom feelings of ressentiment against their masters motivated the creation of new value distinctions. This hypothesis explains moral phenomena in terms of their causes, but it is not clear how it is justified or supported by any kind of science, nor indeed what such a justification or support might be. (p. 37)

This challenge, of course, simply ignores my claim that Nietzsche, like Hume, was a Speculative M-Naturalist, as Nietzsche had to be given the primitive state of psychology in the 19th-century. A Speculative M-Naturalist simply does not claim that the explanatory mechanisms essential to his theory of why humans think and act as they do are supported by existing scientific results. To be sure, what Nietzsche does do is appeal to psychological mechanisms -- such as the seething hatred characteristic of ressentiment -- for which there seems to be ample evidence in both ordinary and historical experience, and weave a narrative showing how that simple mechanism could give rise to particular human beliefs and attitudes. It is, moreover, quite easy to see what empirical evidence would bear on this: e.g., evidence that a psychological state like ressentiment serves diagnostic or predictive purposes. Even in the First Essay of the Genealogy, Nietzsche elicits a variety of kinds of evidence in support of the existence of this psychological mechanism: for example, the facts about the etymology of the terms "good" and "bad"; the general historical fact that Christianity took root among the oppressed classes in the Roman empire; and the rhetoric of the early Church Fathers. Here we see Nietzsche arguing for a characteristically scientific kind of inference: namely, to believe in the causal role of a particular psychological mechanism, for which there is ample independent evidence, on the basis of its wide explanatory scope, i.e., its ability to make sense of a variety of different data points.

Janaway, it bears noting, in fact endorses a weaker version of my reading of Nietzsche as an M-Naturalist, though the weakening seems to derive from his misunderstanding of the role of "results continuity" in my interpretation of Nietzsche's M-Naturalism. He writes that "Nietzsche is a naturalist to the extent that he is committed to a species of theorizing that explains X by locating Y and Z as its causes, where Y and Z's being causes of X is not falsified by our best science" (p. 38). Janaway prefers this account because of his doubts about whether there are actual scientific results supporting Nietzsche's actual causal explanations (a point he, wrongly, thinks I contest). Since my reading of Nietzsche's naturalism emphasized its speculative character, Janaway's formulation serves as a useful way of stating a pertinent constraint on speculative explanations: namely, that they not invoke entities or mechanisms that science has ruled out of bounds. But even so, it may seem an unnecessarily weak criterion: why not expect, instead, that a good speculative naturalist will rely on explanatory mechanisms that enjoy some evidential support, or that enjoy a wide explanatory scope, of the kind we expect genuine explanations in the sciences to exemplify? I do not think there is text in Nietzsche that settles this matter, and so this is more a matter of giving the most philosophically appealing reconstruction of his actual argumentative and explanatory practice.

With respect to Nietzsche's actual argumentative and explanatory practice Janaway is a bit misleading. In a footnote that Janaway invokes more than once (Leiter 2002: 6 n. 10), I describe Nietzsche's M-Naturalism as concerning "Nietzsche's actual philosophical practice, i.e., what he spends most of his time doing in his book." To this, Janaway objects that,

Nietzsche's methods, on the evidence of 'what he spends most of his time doing in his books,' are characterized by artistic devices, rhetoric, provocations of the affects, and exploration of the reader's personal reactions, and show little concern for methods that could informatively be called scientific. (p. 52)

Yet this criticism just betrays Janaway's trademark conflation of Nietzsche's therapeutic practice -- which does, indeed, depend on "artistic devices, rhetoric, provocations of the affects, and explorations of the reader's personal reactions" -- with the cognitive content of his recognizably philosophical claims -- about the origin of morality, the nature of agency, the sources of purportedly "moral" motivation, and so on. The latter, of course, are all part of the naturalistic project that I describe and which Janaway himself acknowledges. Janaway makes a real contribution with his exposition of the therapeutic role of Nietzsche's stylistic devices in the Genealogy, but why he thinks this is incompatible with the naturalistic reading I have defended (and to which Janaway is in large measure sympathetic) is ultimately a bit mysterious.

Janaway and I are farther apart with respect to Nietzsche's conception of human agency and freedom. Janaway takes (pp. 116-120) the passage on "the sovereign individual" (GM II:2) as giving expression to Nietzsche's "positive conception of free will" as "involv[ing] acting fully within one's character, knowing its limits and capabilities, and valuing oneself for what one is rather than for one's conformity to an external standard or to what one ought to be" (p. 118). It seems to me a mistake, however, to read this passage as articulating a kind of ideal of agency or selfhood; in context, I think it is far more plausible to understand the passage as being wholly ironic and mocking.

Start with the portion of GM II:2 that Janaway, like others, takes to be central:

If … we place ourselves at the end of the enormous process [involved in "the morality of custom"], where the tree finally produces its fruit, where society and its morality of custom finally brings to light that to which it was only the means: then we will find as the ripest fruit on its tree the sovereign individual [souveraine Individuum], the individual resembling only himself, free again from the morality of custom, autonomous [autonom] and supermoral (for "autonomous" and "moral" are mutually exclusive), in short, the human being with his own independent, long will, the human being who is permitted to promise -- and in him a proud consciousness, twitching in all his muscles, of what has finally been achieved and become flesh in him, a true consciousness of power and freedom, a feeling of the completion of man himself. This being who has become free, who is really permitted to promise, this lord of the free will, this sovereign -- how could he not know what superiority he thus has over all else that is not permitted to promise and vouch for itself, how much trust, how much fear, how much reverence he awakens -- he "earns" all three -- and how this mastery over himself also necessarily brings with it mastery over circumstances, over nature and all lesser-willed and more unreliable creatures? The "free" [note the quotation marks] human being, the possessor of a long, unbreakable will, has in this possession his standard of value as well … [H]e necessarily … honors the ones like him, the strong and reliable (those who are permitted to promise), -- that is, everyone who promises like a sovereign, weightily, slowly, who is stingy with his trust … . [J]ust as necessarily he will hold his kick in readiness for the frail dogs who promise although they are not permitted to do so, and his switch for the liar who breaks his word already the moment it leaves his mouth. The proud knowledge of the extraordinary privilege of responsibility, the consciousness of this rare freedom, this power over oneself and fate, has sunk into his lowest depth and has become instinct, the dominant instinct: -- what will he call it, this dominant instinct … ? But there is no doubt: this sovereign human being calls it his conscience.

Recall, now, the precise context of this excerpt. The immediately prior section, the first of the Second Essay, is concerned with the question: how does one breed [zücht] an animal [Tier] that is able to make and keep promises, given the natural disposition of the human animal towards forgetting? Nietzsche identifies two breeding techniques: what he calls the "morality of custom" in section 2, and the use of pain as a mnemonic device in section 3. The "sovereign individual" of section 2, then, is simply the culmination of one of the two breeding devices, namely, "the morality of custom," a set of practices by which man becomes, as Nietzsche says, "truly calculable." This individual is "supermoral" -- übersittlich, that is, beyond the morality of custom (sitte) -- because he is simply the perfected animal, the one perfected by the breeding of the morality of custom. But what exactly can this well-trained animal do? Surely it bears remarking that he is described as having one and only one skill: he can actually make and keep a promise! And why can he do that? Because he can remember that he made it, and his behavior is sufficiently regular and predictable, that others will actually act based on his promises. As human achievements go, one might think this a rather modest one. Perhaps this is why Nietzsche gives this ridiculously self-important animal, the so-called sovereign individual, a suitably ridiculous and pompous name: he refers to him, in the original, as the "souveraine Individuum," a mix of French and Latin, meaning, literally, a sovereign atom.[6] Moreover, the "conscience" of this self-important creature, as Nietzsche soon makes clear, consists in nothing more than the ability to remember his debts.

This "sovereign individual," after his brief and melodramatic debut in section 2 of the Second Essay of the Genealogy, never appears again in the Second Essay or, indeed, anywhere in Nietzsche's work. This alleged ideal of "freedom" and agency simply vanishes from the corpus! That, I would suggest, is because he represents not an ideal, but a parody of the contemporary bourgeois who thinks that he has achieved something "unique" -- something individual -- just because he is steady enough to make a promise and honor it. In other words, the modern bourgeois fancies himself the highest fruit of creation simply because he can remember his debts! Janaway, like others in the axis, is surprisingly insensitive to this possibility.

To be sure, Janaway thinks he has other reasons to elevate the tangential and ironic discussion of "the sovereign individual" to the core of Nietzsche's theory of agency. He allows, for example, that Nietzsche was a total skeptic about free will in his early work, citing Human, All-too-Human (I:102) to the effect that "Human beings are no more free than animals, or, indeed than a waterfall," but claiming that he later abandoned such views (p. 111). Unfortunately, Janaway is silent on Nietzsche's reiteration of the same point in one of his very last works, The Antichrist, where he says:

As far as animals are concerned, it was Descartes who, with admirable boldness, first ventured the idea that they could be seen as machine: the whole of physiology has been working to prove this claim. We are logically consistent enough not to exclude humans, as Descartes did: to the extent that human beings are understood at all these days, they are understood as machines

which means that while "people were once endowed with 'free will' as their dowry from a higher order of things … today we have taken even their will away" (sec. 14). Janaway also claims that "it is wrong to think that [Nietzsche] wishes to exclude creative agency from his picture of humanity, because without it his proposed critique of moral values and his project of learning to think and feel in healthier ways would make little sense" (p. 123). Unfortunately, this is a non-sequitur: a critique of moral values, especially one that depends for its effectiveness on producing a non-rational affective response in its readers, does not require "creative" or autonomous agency on the part of its therapeutic subjects, it requires only that Nietzsche's writings cause the requisite non-rational and non-conscious responses that lead to a loosening of the conscious allegiance these subjects feel towards morality. If there is a reason to think Nietzsche believed in free and creative agency, it is not to be found in his concern to critique morality.

Janaway's learned book sometimes errs on the side of excessive detail about historical or philological points without regard for what is philosophically important. This makes the book a valuable resource for Nietzsche scholars, but not always ideal for students or philosophers trying to locate Nietzsche within a landscape of interesting philosophical questions, ancient and modern. But for those who can get past some of the minutiae, there are ample rewards in terms of intelligent and discerning exposition of difficult passages, lucid placing of themes and arguments in historical context, and a rich and sympathetic appreciation of Nietzsche's style, both as a therapeutic tool and for the philosophical assumptions that underlie it.


Clark, Maudemarie. 1990. Nietzsche on Truth and Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Leiter, Brian. 1994. "Perspectivism in Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morals," in R. Schacht (ed.)., Nietzsche, Genealogy, Morality. Berkeley: University of California Press.

---. 2002. Nietzsche on Morality. London: Routledge.

Richardson, John. 1996. Nietzsche's System. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Stroud, Barry. 1977. Hume. London: Routledge.

[1] See esp. p. 212, where Janaway claims, without any support, that "it is beyond question that Nietzsche regards the Genealogy as providing greater knowledge about morality than any combination of the traditional Wissenschaften could have attained unaided," which would only be true if one conflates the therapeutic aims with Nietzsche's philosophical theses about morality.

[2] I use the term "therapeutic" guardedly, since it has become trivialized in philosophy by devotees of Wittgenstein who use it to describe their hero's rather piddling "therapeutic" efforts: e.g., to stop people from worrying about skepticism and other traditional philosophical puzzles. Nietzsche, by contrast, is worried about freeing people from forms of consciousness that are incompatible with human excellence and which would thus render human existence without value. (Janaway, himself, sometimes uses the term "therapeutic" to describe the relevant aspect of Nietzsche's practice [e.g., p. 91].)

[3] Janaway wrongly says (p. 106), immediately following this observation, that it is "Mr. Rash and Curious" (of section 14) who shouts "Enough! Enough!" when, in fact, it is Nietzsche. But this error does not affect Janaway's point.

[4]Janaway has a nice discussion (pp. 158-160, 164) of why contemporaneous influences might have led Nietzsche to such a view.

[5] For those with the patience, Janaway does a lovely job discrediting Nietzsche's careless "French" readers: see esp. his critique of Kelly Oliver at pp. 181-184 as exemplifying a "will to perversity" (p. 185) among some readers of Nietzsche.

[6] Individuum is also, to be sure, a German word, but one suspects that Nietzsche the classicist intended the Latin connotation in this context.