Beyond the Troubled Water of Shifei: From Disputation to Walking-Two-Roads in the Zhuangzi

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Lin Ma and Jaap van Brakel, Beyond the Troubled Water of Shifei: From Disputation to Walking-Two-Roads in the Zhuangzi, SUNY Press, 2019, 283pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781438474823.

Reviewed by Ricki Bliss, Lehigh University


Interpretation is always underdetermined and indeterminate. It is underdetermined by the data and it is indeterminate because meaning doesn't allow it to be any other way. Interpretation is by no means a hopeless enterprise, however. Necessary conditions on the activity of interpretation are: (i) the assumption, on the part of the interpreter, of the family resemblance of forms of life; (ii) the assumption that all general concepts and conceptual schemes in all languages are family resemblance concepts; and (iii) a principle of mutual attunement.

A commitment to all general concepts and conceptual schemes as family resemblance concepts (and schemes) suggests a denial of the ideal language assumption -- that there is an ideal language of thought into which all human languages can be translated that is isomorphic to the objective structure of reality. It also suggests a rejection of the standard notion of a universal. Constraints on the activity of interpretation include the influence of globalization on all human languages and the hermeneutic relativity of the interpreter. Interpretation is never conducted from an objective, valueless, ahistorical vantage point. Nor is it conducted in linguistic vacuums.

This is the view developed in detail in Lin Ma and Jaap van Brakel's Fundamentals of Comparative and Intercultural Philosophy. It is the background against which their exploration of the classical Chinese notions of shi (是) and shifei (是非), the inner chapters of the Zhuangzi and Zhuangzi's philosophical position, is carried out in their book under review here.

Terms central to an understanding of the Zhuangzi are shi, fei and shifei. One can shi or fei a dao, or shifei a judgement, for example. In spite of there being no correlate in Classical Chinese to the expression 'is true', shifei is very often rendered into English as 'true/false'. Against such a translation, Ma and van Brakel detail reasons to believe that not only is 'true/false' the incorrect rendering, but that shifei ought to be understood, instead, as a family resemblance concept.

Depending upon the context of use, shi (and the terms to which it is related in classical Chinese) can be translated into English as 'true', 'being so', 'right', 'correct' and 'fitting', amongst still others. Shifei, on the other hand, bears a family resemblance to dichotomous terms such as 'right/wrong', 'true/false' and 'approve/disapprove'. Ma and van Brakel propose that terms such as shi and shifei be understood as what they call either cluster or hybrid terms. In the case of cluster terms, clusters of Chinese terms such as shi, ran (然), dang (當), etc., are taken to bear family resemblances to cluster terms in the translation language. When translating into English, the aforementioned Chinese cluster could be rendered as 'true', 'right', etc. In the case of hybrid terms, terms such as shifei could even remain untranslated -- as with lone words -- but be understood as belonging within the cluster including 'true/false' and 'right/wrong'. Which of the translations will be settled upon will depend on what the context is in which they are embedded, and what the language is in which the interpreter is operating. Importantly, failing to recognize such family resemblances can cause the interpreter to lose sight of what Ma and van Brakel describe as meanings 'in the large'. Focusing on a particular rendering of the term in a particular context can obscure the richness of what that term might actually convey. So, one supposes, deep familiarity with a language and the culture in which it is embedded is vital to the success of cross-cultural intellectual projects.

Against the ideal language assumption, Ma and van Brakel endorse the notion of a quasi-universal -- a universal that serves a translational purpose chosen in recognition of shared forms of life across traditions, without a commitment to that universal as having a fixed, rigidly defined essence (as expressing family resemblances). Chinese, it is claimed, does not convey dichotomies such as the fact/value and reason/emotion distinctions. In applying to both descriptive and prescriptive circumstances, Shi and fei do not, thus, suppose a fact/value distinction. In light of this, Ma and van Brakel propose understanding shi in terms of the quasi-universal yi (宜)/fitting, where fitting or rightness is borrowed from Goodman. They defend a disavowal of the fact/value distinction in the Western tradition by appeal to Putnam.

Ma and van Brakel have much more to say about the appropriate renderings of shi, and shifei into the English, as well as offering important observations about the uses and interconnections of these terms in their native philosophical and linguistic environments. In the second part of the book Ma and van Brakel turn to territory likely more familiar to those not steeped in the Chinese language tradition: a discussion of Zhuangzi's philosophical project in the inner chapters.

Contrary to commonly received opinion, Ma and van Brakel argue that Zhuangzi is neither a relativist nor a skeptic. On this, they state,

more generally speaking, we suggest that the concepts of and discussions concerning relativism and skepticism only make sense on the assumption of a large number of rigid notions of classification, truth, justification, and so on. These notions are not applicable to Zhuangzi who enjoys free use of language. The labels of relativism and skepticism are not helpful (because of the multifarious meanings of these labels), and irrelevant (because they are not classical Chinese concepts) to promoting our understanding of Zhuangzi. (p. 110)

In light of Ma and van Brakel's background commitments regarding language, interpretation and cross-cultural philosophy (in addition to the conclusions drawn in the earlier chapters), the charges of uselessness and irrelevance are (whilst intriguing) not surprising. Striking, though, is the claim that Zhuangzi himself 'enjoys free use of language'. In stating as much, the volume takes on something of a different tenor, for not only are Ma and van Brakel making a claim about the meaning of the text, and not just about how we ought to engage with it, but they are suggesting that Zhuangzi, like them, denies the ideal language assumption and takes meaning to be underdetermined and indeterminate. Indeed, they later go on to refer to Zhuangzi as an 'early opponent of the ideal language assumption' and as offering in places, 'support for an anti-ideal-language stance and for our commitment to family-resemblance concepts' (p. 135).

The spire of relativism looms large when internal to a domain; there is no criterion by which we can establish absolute truths relative to that domain. In my country we have puppies as pets, but in some other country they eat them for dinner. And if I'm a moral relativist I believe there is no objective moral criterion by which we can judge which one of those cultures is (morally) better. But establishing that my view and the other view are both moral views relativized to a culture requires the application of meta-level criteria, such that we have fixed accounts of what views, morals and cultures are (or perhaps what 'view', 'moral' and 'culture' refer to) in order to bring views into contrast such that we can be relativists about them in the first place. In claiming that Zhuangzi denies the fixedness of meanings, the pathway to any form of relativism is subverted, for where there are no fixed criteria for the applications of terms, there are no views, truths, cultures or theories to provide the means by which anything can be established as being relative to anything else. The scaffolding required to construct the relativist's position is not a scaffolding that Zhuangzi has available to him.

Skepticism pertains to the inability to have certain kinds of knowledge or knowledge in general. There is no expression in classical Chinese that corresponds to the English 'to know'. The term in the Zhuangzi at the centre of discussions of Zhuangzi's skepticism is zhi (知), an expression Ma and van Brakel suggest be understood in terms of the quasi-universal zhi/knowing-understanding. Although Zhuangzi raises doubt concerning certain items of knowledge (no one knows how long the bird Peng is), 'he refrains from reaching a general negative conclusion about zhi, not even for therapeutic purposes' (p. 125).

Discussing both relativism and skepticism, Ma and van Brakel offer the following as a summary of their views:

we conclude that, when taking some clauses from the inner chapters in isolation, they may look like skeptical (or relativistic) statements as seen from a Western perspective. However, if we consider the broader context, the alleged relativist or skeptic (including Zhuangzi) would always be happy to call on all kinds of knowledge. What makes a difference is that Zhuangzi raises doubt about rigid pigeonholing and universal principles governing shifei judgements. We think that Zhuangzi's attitude toward zhi is not as negative as is often assumed, because he associates zhi with rigid criteria. If one does ascribe sceptical attitudes to Zhuangzi, it would be the skepticism that concerns the meaning of words, that is to say: doubt is expressed before the issue of knowledge-understanding arises. (p. 127)

From the rejection of an ideal language assumption, it does not follow, however, that all criteria, indeed even all rigid criteria, governing terms of a language are to be jettisoned. In fact, this cannot be the case lest Zhuangzi's many words be reduced to meaningless drivel. Rather than reading the Zhuangzi as presenting a set of propositions arranged as arguments, Ma and van Brakel propose, instead, that we understand Zhuangzi as endorsing a stance (or stances). Although stances include propositional knowledge and beliefs, they also include attitudes, values, emotional commitments, sensibilities and our attunement to forms of life.

Understanding what the Zhuangzi has to offer in terms of stances allows us, Ma and van Brakel believe, not only to make sense of the many inconsistencies and contradictions in the inner chapters, but to recover its meaningfulness. Indeed, according to them, 'the wrong approach to his writings is to expect that it is possible to integrate everything into one vision. A stance includes visions and many contain numerous contradictions (in particular when one assumes that Zhuangzi wrote a ''philosophical treatise'')' (p. 134). The mistake, it would seem, is in understanding Zhuangzi to be a philosopher in anything like the way we, in the Anglo-analytic West, typically understand them to be.

As might be expected, one aspect of Zhuangzi's stance involves his commitment to the non-fixedness of meanings -- at least the non-fixedness of the meanings of terms that do not refer to ordinary objects like trees, i.e., theoretical terms. Zhuangzi's stance towards knowledge is one of sceptical doubt -- a stance of doubt to all stances including even his own. Related to these stances is what is referred to as walking-two-roads -- a stance involving the sage-like ability to deconstruct and transcend shifei debates made possible by the exploitation of the non-fixedness of meanings and an orientation of doubt. The final stance of Zhaungzi's explored by Ma and van Brakel is that of achieving equality by leaving things uneven -- a stance according to which equality is achieved by allowing things to be as they are; an original and unadulterated evenness that precedes naming conventions and artificial interventions, and honours differences.

In addition to exploring the complexities of how best to understand shi, and shifei, Ma and van Brakel develop a novel account of the inner chapters of the Zhuangzi by way of a systematically applied approach to intercultural philosophy. No doubt, those more immersed in the debates and better versed in the tradition(s) will have much to say about the position(s) staked out by Ma and van Brakel. The suggestions, for example, that Zhuangzi's rejection -- if correct -- of the ideal language assumption provides the means to deny both his relativism and scepticism, or that one can make better sense of the wisdom of the text in terms of stances, are philosophically weighty. That the volume leaves so much intellectual territory waiting to be chartered serves only to heighten its success.

But perhaps most striking, for this reviewer at least, is the methodological self-consciousness that this book exhibits. Not only do they have a view regarding how interpretation, and with it intercultural philosophy, ought to be done, but the book is an extended case study in what happens when that view is applied. Ma and van Brakel patiently and earnestly show us how to do intercultural philosophy. Indeed, I do not think it would be mistaken to go so far as to say that they very humbly deliver a demonstration of how to do philosophy more broadly. And I found it marvellous.

Of the mind that interpretation is always a moral activity, Ma and van Brakel weave an intricate fabric of philosophical views in such a way as to show that they take this commitment to heart. Interpretation in an intercultural context requires sensitivity to the native ecosystems of words and ideas that the texts to be interpreted are grounded in; as well as a sensitivity to the corresponding ecosystems in the translation language. Understanding interpretation as first and foremost an ethical activity, this book shines through the generosity and intellectual decency modelled on each page. Ma and van Brakel bring to bear (often neglected aspects of) the thought of philosophers such as van Fraasen, Goodman and Putnam on aspects of Chinese thought in order to build a positive account of not only how certain ideas ought to be interpreted, but how the interpretations they present can be seen as ones that bear a resemblance to positions that our own thinkers provide us with the means to understand. In ways both obvious and subtle, this volume evidences the intellectual spirit to which Ma and van Brakel are so consciously and refreshingly committed.

One cannot help but notice, however, that the closest they come to getting their barbs out is when they're talking about analytic philosophy. The analytic-Anglophone infatuation with truth and the proposition, along with a few other of our culturally encoded intellectual failings, evidences itself in certain strains of engagement with classical Chinese literature. And this behaviour is admonished by Ma and van Brakel in a number of politely restrained, but well-placed doozies. It is in this spirit, then, that I also take their work -- in both this and their 2016 volume -- to sound something of a warning. Doing intercultural philosophy well is hard. It requires if not linguistic skills, at least a sensitivity to the nuances of the languages in which texts being studied are formulated, as well as to the cultural millieus in which those texts are embedded. More challenging still is the need for an awareness of such things as one's own linguistic context, cultural biases, intellectual vices, philosophical hang-ups. And with the current zeal for diversifying the canon, and the sociological strangeness that that has so much potential to give rise to, one wonders how sensitively and earnestly intercultural philosophy is often being done.

 Ma and van Brakel's book is philosophically and methodologically rich. I recommend it to anyone who is, or hopes to be, interested in Chinese philosophy.