Beyond Versus: The Struggle to Understand the Interaction of Nature and Nurture

Placeholder book cover

James Tabery, Beyond Versus: The Struggle to Understand the Interaction of Nature and Nurture, MIT Press, 2014, 279pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262027373.

Reviewed by Jonathan Michael Kaplan, Oregon State University


This is an engaging new entry in the voluminous literature that attempts to get beyond "nature-nurture" divides. James Tabery develops two related themes. First, that several key historical debates surrounding "nature versus nurture," or more particularly, the relative importance of interactions between genes and environments, should be understood in part through the lens of the different meanings the different sides in the debates ascribed to "interaction," and the different goals that the different sides in the debates had with respect both to explanation and to intervention. Second, that once these differences are properly understood, the differences can be "bridged" via a focus on finding "difference makers" and using these as an entry into the mechanisms involved in development.

The book's clear focus on these themes is one of its major strengths. Tabery is able to restrict the range of issues considered to a manageable scale, and this makes some conceptually difficult material approachable in a way that a larger-ranging book could not. But it can also be frustrating; for readers who are involved with the particular debates in question, the focus on particular aspects of the debates can make it seem, despite Tabery's cautions against this interpretation, like other important aspects of the debates are being deliberately downplayed or ignored.

Tabery traces the debate over "interactions" between nature and nurture (between genes and developmental environments) back to the eugenics movement, during the time of the development of the "modern synthesis" in evolutionary biology. In Chapter 2: "The Origin(s) of Interaction," he argues that the debate between R. A. Fisher (an ardent supporter of the eugenics movement) and Lancelot Hogben (an opponent of the eugenics movement) can be traced (at least in part) to their differing views about 1) the correct interpretation of "interaction" (what it meant for genes and the environment to interact), 2) the correct understanding of the reason to study interaction, and 3) the evidence for interactions of the appropriate sort being relatively common and/or significant in nature. These are, in fact, the three issues surrounding interactionism that Tabery returns to in each of the cases he analyzes.

Fisher, Tabery argues, believed that interactions were merely "statistical" in nature -- roughly, the portion of variance remaining when one performed an analysis of variance (ANOVA) on a population and had accounted for both differences in the trait in question associated with genetic similarities and the differences in the trait in question associated with similar developmental environments (21-23). Fisher believed that the only reason to study interactions was if an insufficient amount of the extant variation could be accounted for by reference to the additive effects of variation associated with the separate similar genetic and developmental environments (22). Finally, Fisher believed that interactions, understood in this statistical way, were likely relatively rare in nature (23-24, 34).

Hogben, on the other hand, believed that interactions were best understood as the necessary process of ordinary development -- particular genes and particular developmental environments interacted to produce particular outcomes (27). It was this developmental interaction that underwrote "norm of reaction" thinking, and produced the differences in the ways that particular genetic endowments could respond to different developmental environments (30-32). That these differences could lead to the sorts of statistical outcomes that Fisher argued could be found via ANOVAs did not imply that the latter exhausted the former. For Hogben, the reason to study interactions was as an entry into understanding development -- a way to start to untangle the complex processes that produced the traits in questions, including (but not limited to) the aspects of the traits that varied systematically in the populations in question (32-33). Understood this way, interactions were ubiquitous; but Hogben expected that even statistical interactions of Fisher's sort would be very common in nature (34).

What remains slightly opaque, however, is the relationship between the different explanatory agendas embraced by Fisher and Hogbed, and the different political agendas the two men pursued. Perhaps it is simply obvious that a program that partitions variation cleanly into environmental and genetic components will tend to lead to the kinds of genetic determinism that make eugenics seems plausible (or, conversely, that a dedication to eugenics will make one tend to support variation-partitioning methodologies) (16-17). Similarly, perhaps it is obvious that a program stressing developmental interaction will encourage an engagement with the different qualities of the developmental environments regularly encountered, and lead to social justice concerns (or, again, that particular kinds of social justice concerns will tend to make one more supportive of developmental interactionist approaches) (24-25).

But the alignment of these political divisions are hardly givens; it seems perfectly possible to support a deeply problematic status quo, or argue for appalling social/political policies, from the standpoint of developmental interactionism. As I note below, if one were to take Terrie Moffitt and Avshalom Caspi's call for pharmacological intervention in low-MAOA seriously, this would involve a commitment to medically treat children living in abusive households, rather than working to prevent the abuse. This only makes sense if one thinks that current patterns of abuse, say, are essentially inevitable. Perhaps because of the focus on interactionism in these debates, Tabery does not explicitly address this kind of pessimism about the possibility of meaningful social change, though the issue arises in several different contexts.

In any event, Tabery next turns his attention to the debate between Arthur Jensen and Richard Lewontin regarding how to interpret racial differences in average performance on IQ tests. Tabery notes that this debate has been interpreted, on both sides, as an issue of political/ideological bias driving the conclusions being argued for (63-64). Again, Tabery focuses on the way each side deals with the interaction between genes and the environment. Jensen supports the claim that much of the "gap" between the average IQ scores of Black and White Americans can be explained by some genetic differences between those populations that are related, in some straightforward way, to the development of the cognitive skills measured on IQ tests ("hereditarianism"). He argues for 1) a strictly statistical interpretation that 2) is important only insofar as it can account for otherwise unexplained variation in the current population(s), and 3) is likely to be rare (58-60). Lewontin takes the opposite tack, on both the question of the evidence for genetic differences directly relevant to IQ test-taking performance, and the proper interpretation of "interaction." Tabery claims that these different approaches meant that "Jensen and Lewontin were largely talking past one another during the IQ controversy because they conceptualized, investigated, and judged evidence of interaction so divergently, and because interaction, for them, was situated in different explanatory frameworks" (71).

Tabery cites me (not unkindly) as one of the "Lewontinians" (63), so it will perhaps come as no surprise that I am somewhat unconvinced by this analysis. Not because I believe that Tabery's analysis of the different meanings and uses of "interaction" at play in the debate are mistaken; his analysis of this aspect of the debate is useful and of real interest. Rather, I am unconvinced because I think the question of "interaction" played a relatively smaller (and rather more confused) role in this debate than Tabery's analysis suggests. Far more important is the recognition that the claim, necessary to get the hereditarian project off the ground, that black and white Americans are living in (roughly) the same range of environments is not merely false, but monstrous. It demands not only that we be insensitive to the actual state of the world, but willing to countenance continued and serious harm to others on the basis of that. And once we recognize that, by virtue of a long history of racism and continued racism today, black Americans experience environments fundamentally unlike those experienced by white Americans, quibbles about the meaning of "interaction" become rather less pressing.

Lewontin's work on the ways in which environments acquire meaning through the actions of the organisms themselves is perhaps the more important observation here (see Lewontin 1985, 100ff). A black child, even one growing up in the same (racist) neighborhood as a white child, will perceive a very different world when looking at the "same" physical reality. Now, perhaps it is merely an odd coincidence that most of the people defending hereditarianism are (or pretend to be) ignorant of how racist our society is, and are in addition vocal supporters of policies seemingly designed to perpetuate a racist status quo. I suppose it is possible that the defense of the hereditarian position is really related to a commitment to seeing interaction as a statistical rather than a developmental phenomenon, etc., and that it is only coincidentally related to racism. But as should be obvious, I think it is rather more likely that it is the racism, and not some theoretical commitment to statistical approaches to understanding variation and interaction, that is doing the real work (Kaplan 2014).

Tabery next turns to the work on gene x environment interactions pioneered by Moffitt and Caspi, with a particular focus on their studies regarding depression and on violent/antisocial behavior. In each case, Caspi and Moffit claimed to have found gene variants that are relatively more sensitive to environmental influences than others. Tabery first explores "dueling meta-analyses" in the case of depression and the variations in the 5-HTTLPR gene. Moffitt and Caspi had concluded that people who had the "short" form of the gene were more sensitive to (more likely to develop depression when exposed to) stressful life events than those with the "long" form of the gene. In the absence of stressful life events, no genotype was markedly more likely to develop depression (the "short" form was somewhat less likely to be associated with depression in the absence of stressful life events, but the effect was both small and not statistically significant). But in the presence of multiple stressful life events, people with the "short" form were significantly more likely to develop depression than those with the "long" form (80). Subsequent research, however, was less clear-cut, and even meta-analyses came to very different conclusions (73-74, 87-91). Tabery once again notes supporters of the interactionist position (those who accept, roughly, the conclusions of Moffitt and Caspi's original study) are interested in interaction as a developmental phenomenon. They want to use it as an entry into understanding the development of the traits in question, whereas those who interpret the evidence as being against a gene x environmental are more interested in partitioning the total variation in depression into separate environmental and genetic components (the latter to be assessed via "genome-wide association studies").

Tabery uses this debate to develop the idea of using the "philosophy of mechanisms" and its focus on "actual difference makers" as a "bridge" between the statistical (variation partitioning) and the developmental (mechanism elucidating) approaches to understanding interaction (Chapters 5 and 6). The study of "actual difference makers" -- things that actually vary in the population, and whose variation is causally associated with different outcomes -- becomes a way to move between studies that focus on population-level variation and those that focus on development. Tabery shows how this work permits us to better evaluate both the extant evidence in, e.g., the 5-HTTLPR/depression case, and to better appreciate the strengths that the different approaches to understanding and studying interaction bring to the table.

In the last chapters, Tabery reflects on the potential uses (and misuses) of research into gene x environment interactions in humans highlighted by Moffitt and Caspi's work. His analysis of the arguments surrounding variation in the promoter regions associated with MAOA, childhood abuse, and violence/antisocial behavior in adults is generally excellent. Caspi et al's original article ends with the claim that "these findings could inform the development of future pharmacological treatments" (2002, 853), but this seems at best an odd place to intervene. Even if such pharmacological treatment were practical, treating the MAOA "deficiency" while leaving the child in an abusive household should seem morally problematic (see Kaplan 2007). Tabery notes, quite correctly, that since there are good reasons to intervene in households with childhood abuse, and because children growing up in households with abuse have a higher chance of becoming violent adults (whatever variant of the MAOA promoter region they have!), the calls for "screening" for MAOA variants and pharmacological interventions seem deeply misguided (182-185).

Perhaps we can think of these calls for pharmacological intervention, genetic screening, and the like as an example of the same kind of bias towards "the world as it is right now, right here" that, e.g., Jensen and his supporters defend. Tabery notes that Jensen faulted Lewontin for a focus on the possible (what might happen in different environments?) rather than the actual (what do our best ANOVAs find?) (61). But as I suggested above, even some of those (e.g., Moffitt and Caspi) committed to interactions understood developmentally seem (at times) to accept that childhood and spousal abuse are just things we have to live with, despite the fact that this kind of abuse takes place at very different rates in different societies, that its frequency changes over time within societies, and that we have, as a society, at least some experience with fighting against these abuses.

This points to a question: What, in the end, is the point of discovering the link between MAOA, childhood abuse, and violence? If the point is to better understand the developmental pathways that lead to particular kinds of behaviors, then the sort of work pioneered by Moffitt and Caspi is potentially of real value. Tabery's analysis of the ways in which statistical outcomes and developmental interaction can be bridged via a focus on mechanisms points clearly in this direction. But if the point is to find more effective interventions in order to reduce the high costs of violence and antisocial behavior, then surely this kind of research is misguided. The wildly different rates of violent crime between societies (and within societies over time) points firmly towards environmental causes, interaction effects notwithstanding, as the most plausible places to intervene (Kaplan 2007). A focus on these larger scale issues -- the ways in which the traits in question vary significantly over time and across societies -- is missing from much of the literature surrounding this work (this may be related to the issue of "pessimism" regarding the possibility of meaningful social change noted above). Tabery misses an opportunity to address that gap.

Tabery's last chapters explore, in a more speculative mode, what discoveries in gene x environmental effects might mean for parenting. Just as some have claimed that medicine is ripe for transformation (as, e.g., personal genomics come to permit the tailoring of pharmacological treatments to individuals), Tabery suggests that recent work on gene x environment interactions in development might lead to individualized parenting recommendations. For example, some research suggests that children with one variety of DRD4 seem to respond much better to "high sensitivity" parenting, whereas those with the alternative version seem to respond somewhat better to "low sensitivity" (disciplinarian) parenting (192-195); if these results are robustly replicated, one can (easily?) imagine, Tabery suggests, parents wanting to know what variety of DRD4 their children have in order to better determine the "best" style of parenting to use (203-204). Or consider the problem of tradeoffs -- environments that are good with respect to the development of some valued trait associated with some genetic variant, but bad with respect to the development of a different trait, associated with a different genetic variant; how will parents choose which trait to attempt to maximize? More generally, will we embrace the "medicalization of parenthood" or decide that other values (e.g., believing that it is simply right to treat one's child with genuine empathy when she or he misbehaves) may trump attempting to maximize some valued outcome? If tried, will such medicalized parenting often "work" or often "backfire"? What, in the end, were we hoping to learn from these kinds of studies, and how should we use the knowledge we gain? Even if one is inclined to be suspicious of this kind of medicalization (as, I admit, I am), Tabery's careful analysis shows clearly why we need to take these kinds of questions seriously.


Caspi A, J McClay, TE Moffitt, J Mill, J Martin, IW Craig, A Taylor, and R Poulton. 2002. "Role of genotype in the cycle of violence in maltreated children." Science 297:851-854

Lewontin, R.C. 1985. "The Organism as the Subject and Object of Evolution." In R. Levins and R.C. Lewontin, The Dialectical Biologist. Harvard University Press. Cambridge, MA, pp. 85-106.

Kaplan, J.M. 2014. "Ignorance, Lies, and Ways of Being Racist." Critical Philosophy of Race 2(2): 160-182.

Kaplan, J.M. 2007. "Violence and Public Health: Exploring the Relationship Between Biological Perspectives on Violent Behavior and Public Health Approaches to Violence Prevention." In H. Kincaid and J. McKitrick (eds.), Establishing Medical Reality. Springer Press. The Netherlands, pp. 199-214.