Beyond Vision: Philosophical Essays

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Casey O'Callaghan, Beyond Vision: Philosophical Essays, Oxford University Press, 2017, 203pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 97801987882964.

Reviewed by Mark Eli Kalderon, University College London


This is a collection of eight essays that extends the project of Casey O'Callaghan's earlier monograph, Sounds: A Philosophical Theory. If visuocentrism is the vice of overgeneralizing from vision to the nature of perception more generally, then its costs are perspective-induced distortion and omission. Approaching the nature of perception from the perspective of vision alone results in a distorted conception since the senses differ importantly from one another, and the nature of perception properly conceived should allow for such diversity. And it results in omission since in focusing exclusively on vision such an approach is blind to such diversity. O'Callaghan aims to uncover lessons from beyond vision, not just about the diversity of the senses, but also about the ways they influence one another and cooperate in extending our perceptual capacities. The essays focus on audition as the principle example of non-visual perception and discuss cross-modal influences and cooperation.

Chapter one presents the theory of sounds defended in O'Callaghan's earlier monograph, though there is new material and anyone interested in O'Callaghan's theory of sounds will want to read it. Chapter two argues that audition involves object perception just as much as vision. But whereas vision involves the perception of ordinary material objects, auditory arguments are sound streams. What makes for an object applicable to both cases is that both visual and audible objects are mereologically composed individuals. Chapter three argues that cross modal illusions show that vision and audition can target common objects and that we hear more than sounds. Chapter four argues that sensible objects are more diverse in general than visible objects and that multimodality is rampant; the connection with hearing more than just sounds is again made. Chapter five argues that, in addition to sounds, we hear sources; indeed we hear sources by hearing the sounds they generate. But not by hearing that they are causally related, but because sources are mereologically related to the sounds we hear. Chapter six argues that the auditory difference between hearing an utterance in a language that you understand and one that you don't doesn't involve perceptual awareness of semantic properties, but is explained, instead, in terms of perceptual awareness of non-semantic, if language-specific, features. Chapter seven argues for the existence of perceptually apparent intermodal featuring binding, with the consequence that perceiving is not just co-consciously seeing, hearing, feeling, tasting, and smelling at the same time. Chapter eight presents a conception of a feature's being modality specific and argues that novel intermodal features may be perceived only through multi-sensory cooperation.

O'Callaghan's writing is lucid, clear, and engaging throughout. He displays laudable energy in considering puzzles raised by the empirical literature, and considerable determination to seeing through aspects of the project inaugurated by his earlier monograph. As O'Callaghan makes clear, there is considerably more to be explored and more to learn.

The continuing case against visuocentrism is welcome, though occasionally weakened by carrying the rhetoric too far. Thus, O'Callaghan claims that a Lockean metaphysics of sound, where sounds are conceived as audible qualities, is due to visuocentrism. However, at least one prominent defender of Lockean metaphysics, Robert Pasnau (1999), discussed by O'Callaghan, is explicitly motivated by a distinct principle, the monism of the sensible, the claim that the objects of at least the distal senses must belong to the same metaphysical category or genus. Pasnau reasons from that principle that, since colors are qualities and audition a distal sense, the sounds we hear must be qualities as well, albeit auditory as opposed to visual. The charge also depends upon the supposition that vision presents material objects and their qualities alone. But it presents more besides. We see shadows, holes, rainbows, and reflections, none of which are easy to describe as material objects or qualities of material objects.

Welcome as well is attention to audible objects other than sound. Thus, O'Callaghan claims that, besides sounds, we also hear their sources. I wonder whether this late addition is perhaps too late. The distal conception of sound championed by Roberto Cassati and Jerome Dokic (1994), Pasnau (1999), and O'Callaghan (2007) crucially turned on the phenomenological claim that the content of auditory experience includes a distal element. But if we hear, in addition to sounds, their sources as well, then since the sources we hear are a distal element of the content of auditory experience, what forces us to conclude that the sounds we hear are distal as well? Perhaps we hear the distal source in, or through, the sound that emanates from it.

The claim that sources are audible potentially undermines O'Callaghan's preferred conception of sound as an event that causes a patterned disturbance to propagate through a dense and elastic medium. Naively, that sounds like a reasonable description of a sound generating event. And it can seem to undermine O'Callaghan's (2007) argument from timbre. If we hear sources, they have audible qualities, and given the connection between timbre and the material structure of objects that determine its resonant modes, isn't timbre better understood as a quality of sources, rather than sounds as O'Callaghan conceives of them, and in a way that tends to undermine just that conception? These are challenges only. And chapter five goes some way to addressing the latter challenge. They are only meant to suggest that exclusive focus on hearing sounds in the discussion of the distal conception of sound by Cassati and Dokic, Pasnau, and O'Callaghan was a potentially damaging oversight that requires further discussion which the present volume importantly contributes to.

O'Callaghan aims to eschew metaphysical controversy, but I wonder whether this metaphysical neutrality is sustainable. The temporal features of sound that distinguish it from ordinary material objects seem more at home with the conception of events that a three-dimensionalist would endorse. And yet O'Callaghan's readiness to treat them as object-like, and as having a mereological composition, seems more at home with the conception of events that a four-dimensionalist would endorse. I doubt that this is a fence upon which one can sit. Relatedly, despite his careful qualifications, I was unclear in what sense, exactly, O'Callaghan claims that sounds are objects. Does "object" here refer to a metaphysical category? Objects, so understood, are at least individuals. Or does "object" refer to what is represented by our psychology and so to something picked out by a psychological or representational category?

If questions remain, this is due to the engaging nature of the present volume and O'Callaghan's undoubtedly correct conviction that there is more to be learned beyond vision. I would recommend it to anyone interested in contemporary philosophy of perception.


Roberto Casati and Jerome Dokic. La philosophie du son. EĢditions Jacqueline Chambon, 1994.

Jason Leddington. "What we hear". In Richard Brown, editor, Consciousness Inside and Out: Phenomenology, Neuroscience, and the Nature of Experience, volume 6 of Studies in Brain and Mind, chapter 21, pages 321-334. Springer, 2014.

Casey O'Callagahan, Sounds: A Philosophical Theory. Oxford University Press. 2007.

Robert Pasnau, "What is sound?" Philosophical Quarterly, 50(196):309-24, 1999.