Beyond Words: Philosophy, Fiction, and the Unsayable

Cleveland Beyond Words

Timothy Cleveland, Beyond Words. Philosophy, Fiction, and the Unsayable, Lexington Books, 2022, 140pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781793614841.

Reviewed by Iris Vidmar Jovanović, University of Rijeka


Imagine, as Timothy Cleveland in his Beyond Words. Philosophy, Fiction, and the Unsayable invites us to do, a world in which Plato’s banishment of art was successful, and “a philosopher [. . .] rules the state in a perfectly rational fashion” (9). What, Cleveland asks, is lost in such a “triumph of philosophical method?” To him, that is obvious: “What would be cut off along with the poets, and all forms of creative expression that sprung from them, is an avenue of innovative expression crucial to discovery, understanding, and knowledge” (10). One crucial aspect of such knowledge, Cleveland goes on to argue, an aspect that cannot be conveyed in other forms of writing, relates to “things we can know or have insight into that are literally unsayable in a theoretical discourse” (11). It is precisely on such a domain of the unsayable that literature can shed light, and when it manages to do so, “the insight that it affords us into that aspect of reality alone should count as philosophy” (11).

This is the main claim Cleveland sets out to defend, characterizing his book as a “philosophical prolegomena to fiction and the unsayable” (4). The book is, however, much more. It can be read as an analysis of language and its capacities for expression, as it thought-provokingly reminds us of how much of our understanding of the world and our experience, both private and social, is determined not only by our linguistic abilities, but by the semantic possibilities available to any given language at any given time. As an analysis of the particular ways in which great works of art are imbued with cognitive potential, the book is a nice reminder that in its best instances, art conveys insights which are not strictly propositional and are not conveyed in precise arguments but are nevertheless of immense help in our coming to terms with our experience, emotions, and moral psychology. On top of that, the book is a valuable contribution to the debate on the limits of philosophical inquiries, as well as an insightful suggestion on how art can be seen as doing philosophy. It opens and closes with reflections on Plato, reminding us yet again of why the ancient quarrel to which he he drew our attention is still so dominant in contemporary debates over the value of art, science, and philosophy.

In the second chapter, Cleveland sets out to explain the experience of the unsayable, illuminating his claims by referencing Kant, F. H. Bradley, Wittgenstein and David Foster Wallace. The challenge for the book—or, as the author says, the paradox—is in providing means to talk about something that by definition cannot be expressed in language, i.e., the unsayable itself. To give substance to this notion, Cleveland explores what he sees as the prime candidates of the unsayable: sense experience and knowledge by acquaintance. What is here defined as of crucial concern, one which resonates throughout the book, is the question of whether “that knowledge will someday be expressible in the objectively shareable propositions of a plausible theory” (37). As Cleveland shows in the third chapter, working within the account of ineffability developed by Silvia Jonas, the challenge is to understand the difference between things which are unsayable in principle, and things which are trivially unsayable, due to some kind of epistemic constraints.

Much of this chapter relates to understanding the development of language—a process Cleveland refers to as semantic expansion. Lurking behind his ideas are Wittgenstein’s and Davidson’s views on language and meaning. Cleveland’s analyses of these views culminate in what he calls “a constructive dilemma”, which concludes that “either there is something that is unsayable or inexpressible in principle or for any language L, there is a time when there is something that is unsayable or inexpressible at that time” (51). For Cleveland, the inexpressible in principle can only be determined by some sort of a transcendental argument, but even if there were such an argument, we could not rest satisfied with it, as, for one thing, it would not explain why we often have a feeling that art provides insights into what is unsayable. More importantly, there are multiple historical examples which show that, for any given moment in time, expressive capacities of any given language are limited, even if eventually the limits are overcome. Thus, Cleveland claims, “as natural language evolves the horizon of language—the limit of what can be said—forever advances. Whether there is something inexpressible in an atemporal sense or what is inexpressible is only temporal, as language evolves and what was once inexpressible becomes expressed, each new language will only push the horizon further—not overtake it” (55). Such things, which cannot be expressed, can be shown—this brings us to the core of Cleveland’s argument—and “at any time, there are great literary works of fiction and poetry that do achieve this kind of showing of the unsayable. If so, their doing so is of philosophical importance” (55).

Before fully elaborating on this claim, Cleveland first discusses, in chapter four, his notion of showing, through literature, that which cannot be said. Crucial here is Cleveland’s discussion of the account of how art shows us things, articulated by Philip Kitcher in his elaborate analysis of Thomas Mann’s Death in Venice. On Cleveland’s view, while Kitcher’s analysis is a valuable contribution to the debate on the philosophical contribution of art, it does not collide with his own views. That is, Kitcher’s theory is applicable only to instances in which works of literature show something that has been said independently by philosophers, not something that is unsayable at the specific time. To properly understand the notion of the unsayable that literature can show, Cleveland, in chapter five, provides a full account of his theory of showing what cannot be said, relying on an extensive analysis of The Waste Land—a poem which, through its particular formal choices, “exhibits a complex, unnamed emotion not captured in terms of our known psychological discourse and that perhaps defies so capturing or expressing in such simple, abstract terms at all” (87). The inspiration for such an analysis comes from T.S. Eliot’s writings on Dante, who, on Eliot’s view, had an ability to perceive more clearly than ordinary people and to experience emotional subtleties available to others only with the help of the poet. The poet can find new linguistic ways of expressing things, which is why it can expand “the ordinary consciousness through the creative use of language to a more refined awareness, recognition, and understanding” (99). As Cleveland states in the conclusion, had Plato realized such capacities of poetic expression, “he could have welcomed in the poets as important, even indispensable, contributors to philosophy” (110). Since Plato failed to realize this, it is up to us not to repeat his mistake.

Such a conclusion is a valuable one, and Cleveland is to be congratulated for reminding us about the harmful consequences of not taking the cognitive value of art seriously. The book is also a valuable reminder of some of the issues repeatedly raised throughout history, such as that concerning the epistemic significance of poets and artists. T.S. Eliot’s view on Dante may take the central stage in Cleveland’s account, but it is somewhat surprising that Cleveland does not reference Wordsworth’s and Shelley’s views on the epistemic primacy of the poet. Views that poetry continues and is more successful in addressing philosophical concerns have been well established within theories on poetry, not to mention in poems themselves, developed by figures such as Hölderlin or Shelley. Cleveland’s theory is in that respect a continuation of a view of poetry well established in the literary tradition, with the additional expansion of it into fiction. Of course, one may question whether the same kinds of mechanisms that enable poetry to show the inexpressible are operative in fiction, due to differences in formal aspects of the two modes of writings, but Cleveland is not concerned with such distinctions and attributes such capacity to works of literature (and to Terrence Malick’s film The Thin Red Line (2), independently of whether they are fiction, literature, or poetry. Nevertheless, the view of the epistemic and linguistic capacities of writers that emerges from Cleveland is worth taking seriously, given how often great works of literary art leave us speechless in light of their power to bring to our attention things we were previously unaware of. However, what is missing from his account is a more elaborate epistemic grounding of his theory: for example, what justifies the reader in accepting the insights allegedly provided by literature? How precisely does one recognize, interpret or respond to such showings, and how permanent are their impacts? What makes the writers authoritative with respect to the insights they provide (other than, or in addition to, their special talent Cleveland seems to be postulating, following T.S. Eliot’s guide)? All of these questions are of pressing interest in contemporary debates on the cognitive value and philosophical aspirations of literature and one should address them in developing a theory on what literature can accomplish for us cognitively. Given that Cleveland is mostly silent on these, the book is probably better suited to those who work within the philosophy of language, considering the care the author takes in discussing expressivity.

Another thinker whose views on poetry are similar to Cleveland’s is Kant, but Cleveland does not reference him, although he discusses Kant’s views on things which lie beyond our empirical knowledge. In his Critique of the Power of Judgment Kant famously argued that poetry, the highest amongst the arts, holds this particular place precisely because of its capacity to express things which are otherwise inexpressible. And while for Kant that does not elevate poetry to philosophy, poetry ultimately comes out as primarily capable of illuminating metaphysical concepts, through its presentation of aesthetic ideas. In addition, Kant too was sensitive to poetry’s capacity to represent what is given in experience but never as fully as in poetic depiction itself. In §49 of his third Critique, he writes: “The poet ventures to make sensible rational ideas of invisible beings, the kingdom of the blessed, the kingdom of hell, eternity, creation, etc., as well as to make that of which there are examples in experience, e.g., death, envy, and all sorts of vices, as well as love, fame, etc., sensible beyond the limits of experience, with a completeness that goes beyond anything of which there is an example in nature” (emphasis mine). It would be interesting to see Cleveland’s thoughts on this account. 

Furthermore, it is worth considering some of the outcomes of Cleveland’s theory for our views on what makes literature, and philosophy, valuable. Cleveland’s theory implies that literature is ‘one step ahead’ in comparison to sciences and philosophy in providing insights about various domains of our experience. If that is the case, the worry (often highlighted by aesthetic anti-cognitivists such as Plato or, more recently, Peter Lamarque (2007)) arises: in light of such a unique capacity of literature, why hasn’t it been awarded any recognition for its insights outside the small circle of literary enthusiasts who have no other evidence to back up their claims, except for their personal experience? Furthermore, how justified is Cleveland in claiming that such a capacity of literature is, ultimately, a manner of doing philosophy? Furthermore, does the claim presuppose that literature’s cognitive value is to be reduced to its capacity to do philosophy? Cleveland first suggests that literature often manages what philosophy cannot—give us access into things we can’t put our hand on, so to speak—but then argues that, when literature does so, it is in fact doing philosophy. This strikes me as a kind of reduction of literature’s value to its engagement with philosophy. Cleveland does not say much about this, but it seems like an omission in his theory not to develop a more specific account of the value of literature, beyond its supposed capacity to do philosophy. In other words, Cleveland seems to be defending the value of literature by grounding this value only in some single aspect. But surely, literature is valuable also for numerous other reasons.

On the other hand, it is questionable whether Cleveland can characterize literature’s particular capacity to show what cannot be expressed as ‘doing philosophy’, particularly after stating that philosophy itself remains silent on these issues almost by default. The claim itself presupposes a strong view on what philosophy is, one which is not necessarily widely accepted. For example, in a similar discussion on the possibility of philosophical poetry, John Gibson (2017) has suggested that there are no philosophical themes; there are intellectual themes which can be tackled either in a philosophical or in a literary manner. Cleveland seems to think that philosophy has some particular domain of issues it is concerned with, and even if it falls short in articulating insights with respect to that domain, when literature succeeds in doing so, it does philosophy. That may well be, but more needs to be said about why that is the case.

Despite these worries, I recommend the book to everyone interested in questions regarding literature and philosophy that issue from the ancient quarrel. Cleveland writes clearly and pushes his arguments forward through a maze of different philosophical disciplines. As he himself states, this book was written primarily in order to honor two of his great loves, literature and philosophy, and the result is a book that invites a similar degree of enthusiasm and dedication. Concerned with the unsayable, the book, almost paradoxically, manages to say (and show!) how inspiring philosophy can be, when it is done from the heart. Most importantly perhaps, in the age when literacy is rapidly declining and fewer and fewer people read, with the STEM-areas trumping the humanities all around the world, Cleveland’s book is a much-needed reminder that certain things just are beyond theoretical grasp: they can only be shown to us by art. One can only hope that its messages will resonate with those who fail to acknowledge the social, cultural, and educational values of the arts and philosophy.


This work has been supported in part by Croatian Science Foundation under the project number UIP-2020-02-1309.


Gibson, John (2017), ‘What Makes a Poem Philosophical?’, in K. Zumha-gen-Zekple & M. LeMahieu (eds). Wittgenstein and Modernism, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 130–152.

Lamarque, Peter (2007), “Learning from Literature” in J. Gibson, W. Huemer and L. Pocci (eds).  A Sense of the World: Essays on Fiction, Narrative and Knowledge, New York: Routledge,13–23.